Aristotle on Truth

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Paolo Crivelli, Aristotle on Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 352pp, $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521823285.

Reviewed by Ursula Coope, Birkbeck College, University of London


In Aristotle on Truth Paolo Crivelli aims to reconstruct Aristotle’s views on truth and falsehood. His approach is to ask a series of questions and attempt to show how Aristotle would answer them. A list of these questions gives a good impression of the scope of the book. He asks: ‘What are the bearers of truth and falsehood?’ ‘What are the truth conditions for predicative assertions?’ ‘What account can Aristotle give of the truth conditions of what seem to be predicative assertions with an “empty” predicate or subject?’ ‘Does Aristotle have a correspondence theory of truth (and if so, what type of correspondence theory is it)?’ ‘What is the relation between truth and time (and in particular, how is it possible, on Aristotle’s view, for the bearers of truth and falsity to have different truth values at different times)?’ ‘Is truth a genuine property?’ ‘What is (or would be) Aristotle’s response to the liar paradox?’ ‘Does Aristotle reject the principle of bivalence?’

As the range of these questions suggests, this is a book that will be of interest not only to ancient philosophers but also to those working in modern philosophy of language and in metaphysics. It is densely argued and is written in a clear, economical style. Throughout, Crivelli combines the highest standards of scholarship with a concern to engage philosophically with the texts he discusses.

As Crivelli himself recognises, his method of asking Aristotle questions from modern analytic philosophy invites the charge of anachronism. It is unlikely that all the questions he discusses are questions that Aristotle himself thought of (or even had the conceptual apparatus to formulate). Crivelli faces this problem head on. His approach, he says, is to reconstruct what Aristotle would have said in answer to these questions. Whether such a method is fruitful can only be judged on the basis of its results in any particular case. It is, I think, undeniable that Crivelli’s book greatly enhances our understanding of Aristotle, even if one suspects that Aristotle himself might have had something to learn from the results.

The book’s introduction discusses these methodological concerns and also lays out, in outline, the views about truth that Crivelli will attribute to Aristotle. This is very useful. Crivelli’s project is complicated. He aims not only to describe a sophisticated (and unfamiliar) theory of truth but also to engage in the close textual analysis needed in order to support his contention that Aristotle is committed to this theory. The introductory chapter, which describes the theory without attempting to defend the attribution of it to Aristotle, enables Crivelli to achieve all this with maximum clarity.

In Part I, Crivelli discusses the bearers of truth and falsehood and the truth conditions of predicative thoughts and sentences. He argues that, for Aristotle, the bearers of truth and falsehood are of three main types: sentences (or more precisely, utterances), thoughts (that is, thought tokens) and objects — both composite objects (such as states of affairs and possibly material substances) and simple objects (such as essences and immaterial substances). The most striking feature of this view is its attribution of truth and falsehood to objects. Crivelli argues that objects that are true or false have a role in explaining what it is for thoughts and sentences to be true or false.

The evidence for attributing to Aristotle the view that objects, such as states of affairs and material substances, can be bearers of truth and falsehood is drawn chiefly from two passages of the Metaphysics: D28 and Θ10. Crivelli makes a good case for his interpretation of these passages, but there is one point on which I find his argument unconvincing. This is his attempt to resolve an apparent inconsistency between Θ10 and another passage in the Metaphysics, E4. In Θ10, Aristotle seems to imply that ‘being in the strictest sense true’ and ‘being in the strictest sense false’ hold of objects, but in E4, he appears to say that objects cannot be true or false: ‘falsehood and truth are not in objects … but in thought’ (1027b25-7). Crivelli attempts to reconcile these two passages by arguing that ‘being in the strictest sense true’ does not entail being true: ‘being in the strictest sense true’ and ‘being in the strictest sense false’ hold only of objects, whereas truth and falsehood hold only of thoughts. The truth and falsehood that hold of thoughts are defined by appealing to the ‘being in the strictest sense true’ and ‘being in the strictest sense false’ that hold of objects. This is an ingenious attempt at reconciliation. However, I find it hard to believe that Aristotle would call something ‘F in the strictest sense’ (kuriôtata), if he thought that in fact it was not F. The argument would be more convincing if Crivelli could give an example of an analogous claim elsewhere in Aristotle’s work. Of course, it is very much a matter of judgement how far one should attempt to interpret Aristotle in such a way that the claims he makes in different places are consistent. In this case, I would be inclined to accept inconsistency, rather than adopt an interpretation on which ‘being in the strictest sense true’ does not entail being true.

In Part II, Crivelli argues that Aristotle’s theory of truth is a type of correspondence theory and explains how Aristotle would respond to certain puzzles that arise for such a theory. It is common, in contemporary discussions of truth, to cite Aristotle as an example of an early correspondence theorist. Marian David begins his entry on the correspondence theory in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy: ‘the correspondence theory is often traced back to Aristotle’s well-known definition of truth’. But there are many different types of correspondence theory. Crivelli makes an important contribution to these discussions by explaining just what type of correspondence theory Aristotle holds. One understanding of ‘correspondence theory’ is a theory on which an assertion is true just in case there is some fact to which it corresponds (and false just in case there is no fact to which it corresponds). Crivelli argues that since Aristotle’s theory does not mention facts, on this conception it does not count as a correspondence theory. The sense in which Aristotle’s theory is a correspondence theory is that it is a theory on which the truth of an assertion consists in its being isomorphic to reality. More specifically, it is a theory that provides a classification of assertions, associates with each class some characteristic that can hold of the items an assertion is about, and claims that an assertion is true when and only when the characteristic associated with its class holds of the items it is about (p. 129). Crivelli points out that Aristotle’s theory also counts as a correspondence theory according to another, stricter, conception, which he calls ‘mirroring’: ‘each class of assertions in Aristotle’s theory of truth is singled out by the property of asserting that the attribute on which it is mapped obtains’. Because of this, on Aristotle’s theory an assertion is true when and only when it ‘asserts its object to be as it is’ (p. 137).

The remainder of Part II presents Aristotle’s responses to two problems that arise for his type of correspondence theory: the paradox of the Liar and the problem of vacuous terms. Crivelli’s discussion of the paradox of the Liar is particularly interesting, though it is somewhat speculative. As Crivelli acknowledges, it is far from certain that Aristotle was aware of the paradox of the Liar (at least in its most intractable form). According to the interpretation Crivelli defends, Aristotle presents and responds to this paradox in a passage in Sophistical Refutations 25. Crivelli argues that Aristotle’s solution to the paradox is to claim that the assertion on which it depends (an utterance of ‘I am speaking falsely’) is sometimes neither true nor false. Part of the interest of this is that, if it is right, it is an instance (other than the famous discussion of determinism in De Interpretatione 9) in which Aristotle was willing to abandon the principle of bivalence.

The problem of vacuous terms arises because, according to Aristotle’s theory of truth, a true predicative assertion is isomorphic to reality. More specifically, there is an isomorphism between the assertion and a certain state of affairs, this state of affairs being composed of the objects (universals and individuals) that are signified by the assertion’s predicate and subject. The problem of vacuous terms is the problem of what such a theory can say about cases in which either the subject or the predicate of an assertion apparently fails to signify an item of the appropriate kind (that is, is apparently vacuous). Crivelli argues that Aristotle’s response to this is to claim that in every predicative assertion, both the predicate and the subject are non-vacuous. He then goes on to argue that, in fact, Aristotle has the stronger view that in every predicative assertion both the predicate and the subject are non-empty (that is, they signify existent items of the appropriate kinds). Utterances that look like predicative assertions whose subject or predicate is empty (e.g. ‘A goatstag is white’ or ‘A goat is a goatstag’) are, in fact, not genuine predicative assertions.

In Part III, Crivelli discusses the relation between truth and time. He argues that, for Aristotle, any bearer of truth or falsehood can, at least in principle, be true at one time and false at another. He discusses Aristotle’s claim that a sentence (or belief) can go from being true to being false without undergoing a change, and explains this by comparing truth to an Aristotelian relative. A sentence (or belief) is true just in case it is concordant with the external world. On Aristotle’s view, the property expressed by ‘is concordant’ is a relative. Truth (the property expressed by ‘is concordant with the external world’) is not a relative but it is like a relative in certain respects. In particular, it can undergo mere Cambridge change. Something can go from being admired to not being admired without undergoing a change (if there is a change in the people doing the admiring). Similarly a sentence can go from being concordant with the external world to not being concordant with the external world without undergoing a change (if there is a change in the external world). Aristotle says, in Metaphysics N 1088a28-31, that this fact about relatives shows that a relative is ‘least of all a substance and a being’ (that is, is not a genuine property). Crivelli argues that Aristotle would probably draw the same conclusion about truth. This prompts an interesting comparison between Aristotle’s view and modern minimalist theories of truth. While modern minimalist theories are offered as alternatives to the correspondence theory of truth, Aristotle’s view that truth is not a genuine property depends upon his view that truth is a matter of being concordant with the external world.

As we have seen, according to Crivelli, Aristotle thinks that states of affairs are also bearers of truth and falsehood. If this is right, then Aristotle is committed to the view that states of affairs can also go from being true to being false without undergoing a change (since he thinks that substances are the only entities that can undergo change). Crivelli claims that the arguments that show that assertions can be true at one time and false at another without changing can simply be transferred to states of affairs (p. 197). However, this seems a bit quick. Crivelli’s explanation of this fact about assertions depended on a comparison between truth (that is, concordance with the external world) and Aristotelian relatives. But on the account Crivelli attributes to Aristotle, being true for a state of affairs is not a matter of being concordant with the external world. So it is not at all obvious that the arguments that explain how assertions can be true at one time and false at another without changing can also be used to explain how states of affairs can be true at one time and false at another without changing. Crivelli might claim that the state of affairs that Socrates is seated goes from being true to being false in virtue of a change in something else, namely Socrates (just as the sentence ‘Socrates is seated’ goes from being true to being false because of a change in Socrates). However, according to the view Crivelli attributes to Aristotle, Socrates is a component of the state of affairs that Socrates is seated (p. 4). Because of this, there is a need for some explanation of how the change in Socrates can occur without a corresponding change in the state of affairs of which he is a part.

In the last chapter, Crivelli turns to Aristotle’s famous sea-battle argument in De Interpretatione 9. This is a passage on which there is an extensive secondary literature. One distinctive feature of Crivelli’s contribution is that he approaches this text armed with a great deal of independent evidence about Aristotle’s views on truth. On the interpretation he defends, Aristotle’s reply to the determinist’s argument is to claim that some future-tense singular assertions are sometimes neither true nor false. Hence Aristotle here rejects the principle of bivalence. This interpretation gains additional support from view (defended earlier) that Aristotle’s response to the Liar paradox also depends on a rejection of bivalence. It also fits well with Crivelli’s interpretation of Aristotle’s discussion of indeterminate and composite assertions in De Interpretatione 7 and 8. According to Crivelli, these earlier chapters present exceptions to the principle that in every contradictory pair it is always the case that one member is true and the other false. If, in chapter 9, Aristotle is claiming that sometimes both members of a contradictory pair of future-tense singular assertions are neither true nor false, then this chapter presents another exception to the same principle.

Aristotle on Truth is rich in argument and deserves a response much more extensive than can be attempted in a review. It is a very impressive book, full of insightful textual analysis and penetrating philosophical discussion. The topics it covers are important for our understanding of a wide range of Aristotle’s work. I would recommend it to anyone with an interest in Aristotle’s theoretical philosophy.