Aristotle, Plato and Pythagoreanism in the First Century BC: New Directions for Philosophy

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Malcolm Schofield (ed.), Aristotle, Plato and Pythagoreanism in the First Century BC: New Directions for Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 305pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107020115.

Reviewed by Phillip Sidney Horky, Durham University


The study of philosophy in the late Roman Republic and the early Roman Empire, now often known as 'post-Hellenistic' philosophy, is necessarily conjectural.[1] In this way, it resembles 'pre-Socratic' philosophy, which also obtains its character through the fragmentary nature of its preservation. Exegetes and critics from antiquity sought to present the philosophical ideas of their forebears and competitors in their own clothes, with the result of either clarifying or further obscuring them. So too do the modern scholars who, under the editorial guidance of Malcolm Schofield, have produced a synoptic reflection on the history of philosophy in the first century BCE, "a time of new directions in philosophy" (p. xiv).

This book is a sister-volume to the recently published The Philosophy of Antiochus (Cambridge University Press, 2012), edited by David Sedley. Both volumes arose out of a four-year research project at Cambridge on philosophy in the first century BCE, a period that saw the dissolution of the Athenian philosophical schools and a proliferation of new philosophical texts. It was a time of scientific, medical, and rhetorical innovation, of colossal land grabs and danger on the seas, of political revolutions and dubious restorations. The Italian peninsula had not seen such a proliferation of new philosophical ideas since the fifth century BCE, when the Pythagoreans reconceptualized politics, ethics, and scientific knowledge in the ancient world whilst still bearing fresh wounds caused by incursions and wars, sometimes self-inflicted.[2]

Schofield navigates through familiar waters. He is attended by a wide range of scholars whose contributions focus on various underexplored aspects in this period: philosophical 'schools' and their texts (Myrto Hatzimichali, Anna Eunyoung Ju, A. A. Long, and Mauro Bonazzi), science and medicine (Andrea Falcon and Roberto Polito), metaphysics and ontology (Riccardo Chiaradonna and Marwan Rashed), and philosophy as literature (David Sedley, Ingo Gildenhard, and, to a certain extent, Julia Annas). Hatzimichali ("The texts of Plato and Aristotle in the first century BC") opens the volume by interrogating the influential positions of Jonathan Barnes and Harold Tarrant concerning the 'editions' of the texts of Plato and Aristotle arranged by, respectively, Aristophanes of Byzantium and Thrasyllus, and Andronicus of Rhodes.[3] She argues that the activities of "cataloguing, canon-formation and corpus-organisation" in the first century BCE had the greatest effect on posterity, but that to speak of new 'editions' of these textual corpora would be anachronistic and could potentially obscure what is truly unique in this period, namely, new critical approaches to appropriating Platonic and Aristotelian philosophy (p. 12). This raises the question: are we speaking about 'editing' as a dialectical, or a dialogical, activity?

The question of authorizing texts is brought to bear on the 'schools' of philosophy in the chapters by Ju and Bonazzi, who treat the relationships between Stoicism, Platonism, and Pythagoreanism in the first half of the first century BCE. Ju ("Posidonius as historian of philosophy") develops the stimulating conjecture that Poseidonius recovered Pythagoreanism as part of the ancestry of Stoicism, thereby advancing an innovative mathematical ontology and psychology.[4] Her piece challenges easy classification of philosophical doctrines, showing how influential Pythagoreanism was thought to be on some strands of Stoicism. What sort of Pythagoreanism, we might ask? If the answer is something like 'Speusippan' or 'Xenocratean' -- or, more troubling, 'Aristotelian' -- we will need to reassess what we mean by 'Pythagorean'.

Bonazzi ("Pythagoreanizing Aristotle: Eudorus and the systematisation of Platonism") discusses the post-Hellenistic Pythagoreans and Eudorus of Alexandria, further advancing and emending earlier claims he had made concerning these obscure figures in the light of the state of affairs among various Academic affiliations in the first century BCE. Bonazzi sees Eudorus as offering a "doctrinally positive version of Platonism" (p. 165) in his exegesis of the Timaeus, which extends the doctrines of Xenocrates and Crantor. Yet the Xenocratean 'Pythagoreanism' implicit in Eudorus' account bears no obvious marks of the hermeneutics of 'likelihood' (eikos), which is imputed to Eudorus by Plutarch (T 6 Mazzarelli). More, I suggest, needs to be done to make sense of arguments from 'likelihood' among the Middle Platonists, to say nothing of the Early Academy.[5] Scholars might thereby have a better sense of how the philosophers of the first century BCE themselves justified their own speculative activities.

One possible Pythagoreanism in the first century BCE is illustrated in Long's "The eclectic Pythagoreanism of Alexander Polyhistor."[6] Long asks whether Alexander's Pythagorean Commentaries (ap. D.L. 8.25-33) ought to be considered an early instance of Neo-Pythagoreanism, a product of Academic Platonism, or a Stoicizing account, and whether it preserves traces of early, "authentic" Pythagoreanism. His answer is 'yes' -- to all these questions, which means that we are dealing with a learned scholastic who collects parts of the Pythagorean doxography/ies available to him and streamlines them with a consistent literary expression (p. 159). Yet how helpful is the differentiation between 'authentic' and 'pseudo-' Pythagoreanism, especially in the post-Hellenistic era?[7] Indeed, our persistent search for authentic Pythagorean doctrines might be thought to divert us from what are more important questions concerning the circulation of literary and philosophical texts, construction of local philosophical identity in the 'republic of letters', etc., in the first century BCE.

An alternative way to recognize the value of post-Hellenistic philosophical commentary is exemplified in the remarkable chapters of Chiaradonna and Rashed. They seek to elucidate the modalities of critical response to Aristotle's Categories among, respectively, Platonists and Peripatetics in the first century BCE. At issue here is how these various figures critically responded to the ontological propositions of the Categories. Chiaradonna ("Platonist approaches to Aristotle: from Antiochus of Ascalon to Eudorus of Alexandria (and beyond)") seeks to develop a new historical narrative, in which shifting school allegiances are seen to reflect post-first century BCE concerns, whereas Antiochus and Eudorus can be seen as both promoting diverse 'dogmatic' Platonisms (p. 49). Antiochus' approach to Aristotle reflects late Hellenistic conventions in the Peripatos, including a dialectic formed on the practice of debating particular philosophical propositions from various perspectives. The project of Eudorus, like that of the authors of the later Pythagorean treatises, was by contrast integrative, seeking to amalgamate Aristotle's innovations into the Platonic-Pythagorean project, in order to synthesize the ontological theories of earlier philosophers. It's not always clear what 'dogmatic' is taken to mean here, but this imprecision does not affect the quality and depth of engagement of Chiaradonna's vibrant chapter.

Rashed ("Boethus' Aristotelian ontology") too strikes out against the assumption that figures in the Peripatos of the first century BCE followed tradition blindly, arguing that Boethus of Sidon, "a philosopher . . . who accepts the consequences of his ontological decisions, even if they appear to contradict Aristotle's authority" (p. 55) sought to "put matter and the primary substance of the Categories at the centre of his ontology" (p. 54). Boethus' specific philosophical contribution lies in his unique formulation of the hylomorphic form's quality (poion), which Rashed sees as "the bundle of items belonging to non-substance categories -- poia, posa etc. -- and constituting, all together, the form inhering in the matter" (p. 72). The payoff here is that, within Boethus' metaphysics, "the substance itself . . . is nothing but a three-dimensional portion of matter bearing, over a certain period of time, definite features" (p. 77); these definite features, which function as differentia, constitute the "character" of the individual substance. With just a few swipes of his rapier, Rashed manages to uncover a totally unknown Peripatetic approach to metaphysics and the philosophy of language (diverse from, for example, that of Alexander of Aphrodisias), as well as to secure the significance of Boethus' contributions. In the wake of this intrepid chapter, nobody can deny Boethus his rightful place in the history of philosophy.

The contributions of Falcon and Polito bring first century BCE philosophy into the context of, respectively, cosmology and atomistic physics. Falcon's contribution ("Aristotelianism in the first century BC: Xenarchus of Seleucia") represents an extension of his recent monograph -- one is tempted to call it a summary[8] -- with some further thoughts especially on the Peripatetic Xenarchus' approach to the Aristotelian prôton oikeion. He concludes that Xenarchus read Aristotle closely, and that his reading resulted in "adaptation" of Aristotle's ideas (p. 91). The evidence suggests that Xenarchus could oppose Aristotle, as in his physics, or accept Aristotle's claims, as in his ethics. Among first century Peripatetics, Xenarchus does not come off as offering significant philosophical contributions, at least by comparison with Boethus.

Polito ("Asclepiades of Bithynia and Heraclides Ponticus: medical Platonism?") focuses on terminological similarities between the descriptions of atomistic minima in the writings of the fourth century BCE Platonist Heraclides of Pontus and Asclepiades of Bithynia, especially with regard to the physics of sensation. The resulting Asclepiades resembles a Democritean apologist, who adapts earlier Platonist theories of minima, such as those of Xenocrates and Heraclides, to mechanical ends, especially with regard to the nature of inborn heat, which is constituted of friction between corpuscles (p. 123). Polito's scientific care in extricating and classifying the various approaches to particulate theories of matter is countered by his somewhat erratic conjecturing of these thinkers' possible reasons for, and the consequences of, doing so.  According to what criterion of plausibility, for example, can we venture that Heraclides would have given a physiological account of diseases that would have provided "a scientific justification for magical or semi-magical practice, and hence essentially different from Asclepiades' own" (p. 123)?

Annas ("Plato's Laws and Cicero's de Legibus") seeks to redress the dubious apophatic claim, originated by Cicero himself (De Legibus 2.14), that his own On Laws imitated Plato's treatise of the same title only in stylistics and theme. In particular, she argues that Cicero's Stoicizing approach to law involves two important divergences from Plato: Cicero claims universal law for all, while at the same time considering a particular existing legal system, which the Romans already possess, but do not recognize as best. But the similarities are as striking as the differences, and Cicero ends up arguing that the law of the Roman Republic "embodies natural law because it is a system of law which (with a few improvements) fosters virtues and discourages vices, and so leads to a happy life for the citizens" (p. 223). One might quibble with Annas' commitment to reading these texts through the lens of "technical philosophy" (p. 209), or identifying its interlocutors as "explicitly unphilosophical" (p. 222); how helpful, or chronologically apt, is this distinction, especially for a text like Plato's Laws? This conceptual frame seems less to support Annas' otherwise compelling case, than to constitute a red herring.

Two final contributions focus on Cicero's transformation of Platonic philosophy: Sedley's analysis of Cicero's translation of Plato's Timaeus into Latin, and Gildenhard's analysis of Cicero's appropriation of Platonic forms and statesmanship. Sedley ("Cicero and the Timaeus") seeks to grasp the conditions of production of Cicero's translation of the Timaeus, including date and probable goals for composition. He ingeniously argues, by way of close reading of the Greek and Latin texts, that Cicero must have translated a portion of the Timaeus, abandoned the translation, and adapted the working draft to new purposes in de Natura Deorum in late 45 BCE (pp. 188-193). Sedley is quite aware that he is begging the question, providing counterarguments to his claims, at least one of which is said to rest on "a very natural inference" (p. 192). Readers, I suspect, will be less inclined to agree with Sedley than to be dazzled by his interpretive acumen. At any rate, Sedley's incisive analysis (pp. 201-204) of Cicero's arguments from "likelihood" (eikos) and "persuasion" (pithanon) works well to complement Bonazzi's discussion of Eudorus' Pythagoreanism, and points in the direction of more fruitful study.

Gildenhard ("Of Cicero's Plato: fictions, Forms, foundations") draws the volume to a close with a thorough analysis of Cicero's treatment of Plato's forms in the two periods of philosophical production (late 50s and 46-43 BCE). He argues that in Cicero's earlier philosophical works, especially de Legibus, the Platonic forms have no role to play in the strategic reform of ancestral Roman law, whereas by the time of Orator (46 BCE) he advanced an "ideal orator" (summus orator) and the necessary metaphysical apparatus needed to justify his heuristic existence (pp. 248-253). Gildenhard then goes on to compare Cicero's thought experiment with the ascent passage of the Symposium, and to show how other relevant passages ofde Officiis obtain parallels to the hierarchy of being implied in Plato's myth of the Cave (Rep. 7. 516a). He speculates about Cicero's move towards more robust idealization within the political sphere, where Cicero felt deeply the "ontological fading" (p. 273) of the Roman Republic in the 50s, and saw it totally nullified in the wake of the perpetual dictatorship of Caesar. Gildenhard's chapter demonstrates the synoptic circumspection necessary to bring Cicero into balance with Plato, although I was surprised not to see any discussion of the ideal politikos of Plato's Statesman, a text whose importance for Hellenistic and post-Hellenistic political thought remains sadly undisclosed.

Taken together, the various contributions to Schofield's collection establish a robust platform for further debate concerning the changing shape of philosophy in the final years of the Roman Republic, when system-wide collapse yielded an exceptional philosophical harvest.[9]

[1] For 'post-Hellenistic' philosophy, see G. R. Boys-Stones, Post-Hellenistic Philosophy: A Study of its Development from the Stoics to Origen, Oxford 2001, pp. 99-105.

[2] See P. S. Horky, Plato and Pythagoreanism, Oxford 2013, Chapter 3.

[3] See J. Barnes, "Roman Aristotle", in Philosophia Togata II: Plato and Aristotle at Rome, ed. J. Barnes and M. Griffin, Oxford 1997, pp. 51-96 and H. Tarrant, Thrasyllan Platonism, Ithaca 1993.

[4] Unfortunately, Anna Ju passed away before this volume was produced (in March 2010), and the volume is dedicated to her and to Bob Sharples, who also lamentably passed in August 2010.

[5] A significant amount of work has been done recently on eikos arguments among the Presocratics and Plato. See most recently J. Bryan, Likeness and Likelihood in the Presocratics and Plato, Cambridge 2012, who discusses the relevant bibliography.

[6] For full disclosure, I had read and commented on Prof. Long's article in draft form in May 2009, before it was presented in Cambridge.

[7] 'Inauthenticity' or 'illegitimacy' marks the history of Pythagoreanism from its earliest records, which unnecessarily conditions scholarly pursuit of Pythagorean history. See G. Cornelli,In Search of Pythagoreanism, Berlin 2012, Chapter 1, and Horky, op. cit. n. 2, pp. 88-96.

[8] Introductory discussion and summary of A. Falcon, Aristotelianism in the First Century BCE: Xenarchus of Seleucia, Cambridge 2011, arguably takes up more than 40% of his chapter (pp.78-84).

[9] I note a higher number of typographical errors than might be expected from a book published by Cambridge University Press (a period is missing on p. 29; there is an incomplete phrase 'on mantic' on p. 39; "will be included into the other categories" on p. 59 is ungrammatical; "as they are hand" is missing an 'at' on p. 60; on p. 96, a parenthesis is missing after "sceptical Academy"; Timaeus 54c4-d7 is cited where the Stephanus page should be 53 on p.173 n. 43; "since it is matter of an ancient" is missing an 'a' on p. 177; there is a period instead of a comma at "For the time being." on p. 182; there are two diacritical errors on the quotation of Pseudo-Xenophon on p. 185).