Aristotle's De Anima

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Ronald Polansky, Aristotle's De Anima, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 580pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862745.

Reviewed by Cass Weller, University of Washington


Aristotle's De Anima is a text that has probably occasioned more commentaries than any other of Aristotle's treatises, if one includes late antiquity and the 12th through the 14th centuries. Ron Polansky has produced another. His Aristotle's De Anima is a massive chapter by chapter learned commentary. (Geezer alert (I reluctantly include myself): better have your reading glasses. The side margins are ½ inch. The font of the main body is 9 or 10, I'm guessing. There are 45 lines per page.) This commentary, which relies on the more conservative text of Jannone and Barbotin (1966) rather than Ross's (1961), is rich in detail, thorough in argument, and informed by recent and older literature. There is an especially searching discussion of the sometimes overlooked nutritive/reproductive soul and richly detailed accounts of each of the senses and their media. The discussion of intellect in 3.3-8 is also quite valuable. The book is primarily a resource for specialists, something to be consulted rather than read straight through, although I'm sure a persistent non-specialist would also benefit.

The recent interest in De Anima in the last 30 years or so is due largely to Aristotle's explicit anti-Platonism and inadvertent anti-Cartesianism regarding the soul and its relation to body. In particular, debate has arisen concerning the extent to which Aristotle's positive views are compatible with the spirit of contemporary physicalism broadly construed, especially in the form of materialist functionalism. And Polansky's book is certainly among the recent work animated by these concerns, but more of this later.

Let me get the small quibbles out of the way. The author invokes, sometimes needlessly, controversial interpretative claims without argument or acknowledgment of controversy. For example, in characterizing the objects of dispositional knowledge in the soul as universal he writes: "As universal they are said of substrata rather than being in substrata or substrata (Cat. 2.1a20-b9)." (242) Perhaps this is an oversight, but Polansky does appear to simply assume without reference to any controversy that only what is said of is universal, and that predicables bearing the relation of being-in to what they're predicated of are either non-repeatable qualia or non-universal particulars of some other sort. The whiteness of this piece of paper belongs to this piece of paper and nothing else. I won't bother to list the articles on this topic. Again, in summing up the discussion of 2.5: "The sense actually perceiving is only likened to the sensible object already in actuality by taking on its sensible form enabling it to perceive it, and hence also to be aware of its perceiving." (248) This is jumping the gun and to no end as far as I can tell. This seems especially curious in light of Polansky's claim of fidelity to Aristotle's underappreciated dialectic. What we are to make of the thesis that emerges in 3.2 that in perceiving x as F we (all sentients?) also perceive that we perceive x as F, and of its dialectical role in the argument of 3.2, is an important question. However, it certainly doesn't follow from the formal explanation of the general phenomenon of perceiving the F-ness of an object, i.e., becoming like the object by taking on its sensible form without its matter, that the perceiver perceives that she is perceiving the object as F.

The commentary on Aristotle's general discussion of sense-perception in 2.5, with which I generally agree, is somewhat overburdened with discussion of the extent to which perceptible objects, when perceived, are causally operative on the perceiver, and this tends to leave out of focus the critical distinction between the changes the sense organs undergo in the material realization of sense-perception and the triggering of the exercise of the psychological ability to perceive objects in the environment. This over-emphasis is due in part to a side dispute with Burnyeat who denies that there is any physical change in the perceiver qua perceiving. Polansky certainly appreciates the distinction as crucial to the material and formal aspects of the account of sense perception. I just wish it figured more prominently in his discussion of 2.5. So I 'm really only offering a friendly after the fact editorial suggestion. Here endeth the quibbles.

As indicated, I generally agree with Polansky's reading of Aristotle's account of perception.[1] So let me first list the points of agreement. Aristotle has a dual account of perception, one pertaining to the material events tracing a causal, albeit non-standard, path from sensible object to medium to sense organ, and another pertaining to the formal aspect of perception which involves not an alteration but the activation of a capacity for sensory awareness of ordinary public objects in their ordinary sensory character. This awareness of public objects is not epistemically mediated by some prior act of awareness of private sensory objects. The exercise of this capacity is described in 2.12 as the sentient creature's having taken on the sensible form of the object without its matter. The latter familiar doctrine is Aristotle's reinterpretation of the leading idea of 2.5 that in perceiving the perceiver becomes like the object which in turn makes dialectical contact with views he canvasses in 1.2-5. (Philoponus, anticipating this reinterpretation, glosses the phrase 'becomes like' with the phrase 'becomes cognitively (γνοστικως) like'.) Let us call this the intentionalist reading. Polansky makes no attempt to father on Aristotle a further reductive account of the intentionality of sense-perception in terms of something else that tells us what the mental aboutness of sense-perception really comes to, perhaps in terms of subcutaneous psychological processes or introspectable items of consciousness. Some might complain, thinking that it leaves Aristotle without a genuine account of the intentionality of sense-perception. Such complaints would be misguided, however. On Aristotle's view it is just a basic and irreducible fact, not to be further explained, that a sentient creature has the power of sense-perception and its taking on the sensible form of an ordinary object, e.g., an olive tree, without the object's matter is sensory awareness of that object under some sensory guise. That said, a brief discussion about the relation of acts of sense-perception to perceptual beliefs would have been welcome. Since sense-perception, unlike phantasia, is discriminative, there is at least the presumption that sense-perception includes both a conceptual and assertoric element. This follows straightforwardly from the claim in 3.2 that in perceiving something sweet and white I perceive that I am perceiving something sweet and white. If such terms of art fail to refer to anything in Aristotle's theory of sense-perception it would be worthwhile to say so.

Another important point Polansky makes is again related to his nonreductivist reading of Aristotle. Or perhaps I should call this his common sense realist reading. The proper sensible features of ordinary objects are genuine features of these objects to which perceivers have direct epistemic access. They are not the secondary qualities of modern philosophy. The objects have these features and not as mere dispositions to produce sensory ideas in perceivers. That's one sense in which the forms of sensibles are in something. It's what the scholastics and Descartes would call the formal or subjective mode of being. In perceiving the object in its sensory character the sensible forms are realized in the perceiver. That's what taking on the sensible form of the object comes to, what the scholastics and Descartes would call the objective mode of being. The forms of the common and proper sensibles realized in the perceiver are not images or appearances projected onto an imagined external cause. The form of White and Sweet and Cubical in the perceiver qua percipient is that by means of which the perceiver, in the typical case, is aware of what is in fact a white sugar cube as white and sweet and cubical. This theme is sustained in Polansky's discussion of phantasia in which he argues for the epistemic independence of sense perception even as he acknowledges the anticipatory role of imagination in perceiving a moving object.

In assessing the plausibility of Aristotle's philosophy of mind regarding sense perception Polansky claims that on his reading Aristotle's account "escapes easy rejection as incredible." (p. 356) He correctly denies that Aristotle subscribes to any kind of reductive materialism (and I would add materialist functionalism) and he also correctly denies that Aristotle subscribes to the immaterialism Burnyeat attributes to him. I say 'immaterialism' because on Burnyeat's reading an act of perception occurs without any physiological change in the sense organs. The reason Polansky claims that Aristotle's account escapes easy rejection as incredible is that he rejects Burnyeat's reading as false. After all it's Burnyeat who answers his own question "Is Aristotle's philosophy of mind credible?" with a resounding "no", having argued for his immaterialist reading. So if Aristotle's account escapes easy rejection as incredible does it escape altogether? Polansky is uncomfortable with the question both because the domain of psychology for Aristotle is so much wider than ours, thus making the question if not exactly anachronistic somehow ill put, and because, Polansky claims, the question is one of metaphysics and De Anima is self-consciously not metaphysics. Nonetheless, he seems prepared to defend Aristotle's psychology against the charge that it is vitiated by its dependence on his incredible physics:

Though his psychology fits within his physics, much of what it depends on in his physics is largely unobjectionable in the way it is put to use within this treatise. Thus his antique physics is not such a liability. (p. 27)

The problem Polansky ignores is, to use Bernard Williams's expression, Aristotle's body-body problem. For Aristotle's view to be attractive to the predominant spirit of contemporary thought as an alternative to Platonic/Cartesian substance dualism there has to be another material body whose nature is not form/soul-dependent, a living corpse, so to speak, which is contingently identical to the animal body that by definition is the realization of the soul. For the body as the matter of an organism is essentially alive. The body of an animal is essentially sentient. But there is no merely physical system upon which states we would characterize as psychological supervene. The physiological processes associated with passions or sensory states are themselves psychological in Aristotle's sense in that they are functionally defined in terms of the powers of the soul. In some sense, of course, the animal body is ultimately composed of the elements. Thus one can modernize Aristotle by trying to find an inorganic body of earth, air, fire, and water to identify with the body made of the various homoiomerous living tissues, but any success in that venture would be short lived, since it is based on the modern presumption that this inorganic body and the materials of which it is constituted would be more ontologically basic than the living body they ground. This might do for Empedocles, but it gets Aristotle backwards. On his view a living organism, or I should say its soul/form, is what is ontologically basic. One, however, needn't acquiesce in the modern presumption that what ultimately materially constitutes anything including living organisms is ontologically more basic, but an argument is needed.

[1] It's the view found in Weller (Review of Essays on Aristotle's De Anima, edd. Martha Nussbaum and Amelie Rorty, Bryn Mawr Classical Review, Vol. 3, No. 6, pp. 283-96, Dec. 1992) and Lear (Aristotle: The Desire to Understand, Cambridge University Press, 1988).