Aristotle's Dialogue with Socrates: On the Nicomachean Ethics

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Ronna Burger, Aristotle's Dialogue with Socrates: On the Nicomachean Ethics, University of Chicago Press, 2008, 309pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226080505.

Reviewed by Steven Skultety, University of Mississippi


Anyone who reads this incredibly thought-provoking book should first decide what he or she expects from a work in the "setting figures in dialogue" genre. It seems to me that works setting philosopher X in dialogue with philosopher Y lend themselves to making three types of claims: (1) the biographical claim that any complete account of X's psychological life will need to incorporate Y; (2) an evaluative claim that since X purposely constructed premises and conclusions as responses to Y, what X meant and intended by these claims cannot be comprehended without the recognition of Y's influence; and (3) the heuristic claim that the reader should keep Y in mind when considering X, as this will bring to light some dimension of X's work which would otherwise have been missed. At no point in this work does Burger enter the terrain of history or biography (1). Moreover, she straightforwardly declares in the Introduction that her work is not evaluative in the sense of (2): the work is offered "not in the spirit of an empirical claim about what Aristotle had in mind when writing the Ethics, but as a tool of interpretation, to be judged by the philosophical results it yields, in particular, the underlying argument it discloses whose movement makes the work a whole" (p. 5). Burger does achieve the wholeness that she herself sets down as a criterion of success, though, as I will argue at the end of this review, it comes at a cost. But readers who, from the start, have an aversion to heuristic (3) readings of the Nicomachean Ethics will probably not enjoy Burger's book.


Those who are nevertheless intrigued by the possibility of viewing the Ethics as whole from a new perspective will find in this book an astonishing proposal: the entire Nicomachean Ethics can be read as an extended tribute to the power of Socratic ethics. On the face of it, that should sound rather strange, especially given Aristotle's unapologetic attacks upon two famous positions he himself attributes to Socrates, namely that virtue is knowledge and that akrasia is impossible. But Burger's hunch is that this strong version of intellectualism that takes so much critical fire is a cartoonish rendition of actual Socratic philosophy. Like Socrates, Aristotle believes that ethics centers upon the question of the good life for human beings, and the straw-man version of Socratic ethics we see in the Ethics is really just a dialogic foil that Aristotle uses to develop his own nuanced ethical theory. At the end of the day, the position Aristotle settles upon is quite similar to that of the complex figure in Plato's dialogues -- the "Platonic Socrates" or, perhaps if you think that Plato himself is using Socrates to espouse his own views, "Socratic Plato."

How could the Nicomachean Ethics as a whole be Socratic? Burger believes the work falls roughly into two main sections, books I-VI, and books VI-X (book VI serves as a kind of "pivot" for the two parts), with each section following a similar back-and-forth movement. Both begin by suggesting that intellectual virtue unifies the whole of virtue. Then, as if trying distance himself from a position that sounds so Socratic, Aristotle introduces new considerations that appear to make the unity of virtue impossible. But next, as he explores the full implications of these additions, he finds that they do not differentiate virtues as originally suggested and, ultimately, is drawn back to a far more Socratic theory in which intellectual virtue dominates.

The specific ebb-and-flow of the first section breaks down as follows. In developing an account of happiness, Aristotle concludes his famous function argument with the discovery that the distinctive human function is "some practice (praktikē) of that which has logos." Since, Burger reasons, this statement concerns action, it seems that the perfection of practical reason -- phronēsis -- should be human virtue. But Aristotle immediately attempts to squash whatever Socratic overtones this finding may have, asserting not only that there is a plurality of virtues, but maintaining that there are two fundamentally different kinds of virtue because the soul itself has two kinds of parts (Chapter 1). In a fully anti-Socratic mode, Aristotle goes on to develop a theory that will support the notion of an independent realm of character virtue. He insists that character virtue is not merely the acquisition of logoi from teaching as Socrates suggests in the Phaedo, but the product of habituating distinct passions of the soul; indeed, character virtue is eventually construed as an ability to avoid two emotional extremes (Chapter 2). Finally, in his detailed account of the individual character virtues, he does not try to legitimize them by subsuming them within the realm of phronēsis, but rather argues that these virtues derive their value from the independent standards of beauty (to kalon) and justice (Chapter 3).

So goes the attempt to keep the intellectualist at bay from books II to V. But Burger detects a lack of conviction in the viability of this apparently anti-Socratic theory. First, though Aristotle identifies virtuous action with the avoidance of two extreme character states late in book II, he never explains how this way of theorizing virtue is to be reconciled with the account he gave at the beginning of that book, according to which virtue is action in accordance with logos as the phronimos would determine it. Moreover, while his articulation of justice does begin by emphasizing over-arching standards, by the end of his account we find him admitting that it is phronēsis which makes justice possible. Finally, though Aristotle uses beauty to distinguish authentic from imitation virtue in his analysis of the first five character virtues (courage through greatness of soul), he completely abandons this standard when discussing the remaining virtues (proper love of honor through wittiness). By the time Aristotle explicitly announces the unity of virtue at the end of book VI, insisting that character virtues cannot exist independently of phronēsis, the reader should not be surprised. She has been watching Aristotle lose confidence in this independence over the course of the three previous books.

While book VI thus represents a retreat and an admission of a type of intellectualism, Aristotle has not returned all the way back to the book I position which suggested that phronēsis was the dominant human virtue. For in book VI we learn that while the centrality of phronēsis entails the dependence of ethical virtue, phronēsis itself plays second fiddle to the intellectual virtue of sophia. Whereas book I and the subsequent discussion of ethical virtue may have led us to think that someone like Pericles was the embodiment of virtue, book VI makes it clear that the person who embodies virtue is one who organizes his entire life around the goal of wisdom -- like many Pre-Socratics, or, indeed, like the Socrates who shows up in the Platonic dialogues (Chapter 4). So, even though the exact account of how an intellectual virtue unifies all of virtue has changed, Aristotle is back to where he started in that he is advocating a position that sounds terribly Socratic.

Therefore, at this point in the text, Aristotle must start anew and do his best to discover a better way of distinguishing himself from his intellectualist adversary. The search for this sort of distinction motivates book VII: Socrates thought that akrasia was impossible, and Aristotle denies that this is so -- and so here, surely, Aristotle has a clear contrast that will allow him to differentiate his own position from Socratic intellectualism once and for all. And, at first, it looks like Aristotle is successful: while Socrates thinks that ignorance alone explains why people reach the wrong ethical conclusions, Aristotle believes that an agent adopts an incorrect premise in the moment of decision-making because of a "physiological" cause. Yet, as Aristotle delves deeper into the issue of akrasia, he finds that the explanation for why some people are able to preserve true opinions in spite of such causes is that they possess phronēsis … much as Socrates himself would have maintained (Chapter 5).

Once again, Aristotle did his best to distance his own theory from intellectualism, only to be driven back into the Socratic fold. And now, with two failed attempts behind him, it is as if Aristotle throws in the towel and completely surrenders to Socrates in books VIII through X. First, when describing the complete friendship that can only take place among the virtuous, Aristotle jettisons the metaphysical account of a soul according to which it is a whole with parts, replacing this account with "the logic of essence, which makes mind, whatever its variety of functions, the unifying principle of identity that constitutes a self" (p. 173). Virtuous people are no longer those who harmonize an idiosyncratic batch of irrational and rational parts, but rather those who cultivate impersonal and anonymous minds. This metaphysical alteration of the soul also makes possible a grand reconciliation of what had been an on-going tension between ethical excellence and intellectual excellence, politics and the philosophical search for truth. All the way back in book I of the Ethics it was clear that the sorts of friendships one finds in a political community are necessary for human flourishing; but now we learn that perfect versions of such political friendships involve minds interacting with one another. In other words, books VIII and IX show us that political friendship culminates in the friendship of philosophers centered upon dialogue (Chapter 6). When, then, Aristotle adopts an "exclusivist" conception of happiness near the end of the Ethics, dramatically reversing himself on so many crucial issues and adopting a position that even makes it look as if it was a mistake to suggest that the soul depends on body, readers should see that Aristotle has succumbed to Socrates. Indeed, having reached the conclusion of the Ethics, and now in a position to reflect upon the entire course of the argument, we can see that this work does not simply end with Socratic doctrine. On the contrary, we can see that the entire Nicomachean Ethics has been a certain kind of deed -- an on-going dialogue among philosophers. Aristotle has spent ten books articulating the give-and-take between a "Socratic" view and his own extreme anti-"Socratic" view, ending with the paradoxical claim that our ethical actions should be oriented around non-ethical theoretical contemplation. The Ethics has been an Aristotelian version of a Platonic dialogue (Chapter 7).


It is impossible to do justice to the subtlety and density of Burger's work in such a brief overview. Indeed, my sketch threatens to suggest that Aristotle's Dialogue with Socrates is somewhat formulaic, but nothing could be further from the truth: the reader will be filled with a genuine sense of anticipation as this work moves to its culminating conclusion. Moreover -- and this is an aspect of the work that deserves special praise -- the entire monograph is brimming with interesting observations about the connections between passages in the Nicomachean Ethics and specific exchanges within various Platonic dialogues. Burger is an author who has a tremendous number of ideas about a wide variety of passages in both authors, and I think scholars of Plato will find this work just as insightful as those who focus upon Aristotle.

I fear, however, that the sheer number of observations Burger wanted to make in this book may have contributed to what I consider to be one of its biggest problems: the book often reads as if it is suspended between different projects, unsure whether it should aspire to be a commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics or rather should settle for being a monograph defending a focused interpretive thesis. My worry is that Burger has tried to do both, and that, as a result, the finished product is not quite a success as either. Like a commentary, this book does march through, in sequential order, every chapter and major issue of the Ethics. Yet, in an actual commentary, one would have expected far more analysis of particularly contentious and convoluted passages, as well as a discussion of the interpretive issues and debates surrounding them. Instead, because Burger does not want to get bogged down in any particular scholarly dispute that would lead her away from the main narrative, Burger hastily picks sides in these debates with little extended argument (for example, Burger announces that Aristotle seems to embrace an "exclusivist" conception of happiness with almost no defense during her discussion of X.7-8). On the other hand, if this work is read as a monograph defending the thesis that the Ethics is Aristotle's version of a Platonic dialogue, the reader will wonder why she is made to go through the entire Ethics, chapter by chapter, distinction by distinction, even when Socrates is not involved in any direct way. For example, in the stretch of text from pages 153 to 206 (nearly a quarter of the book) Socrates does not make a single appearance. Of course these sections are still worth the reader's time. But Burger may have been better served by seven chapters advancing seven independent arguments for the thesis that the Ethics is Socratic rather than seven chapters that parcel up the Ethics into seven parts, each of which gets a quasi-commentary.

In fact, dividing up the Ethics seems to be one of Burger's primary tactics for making her thesis plausible. Like a pharmacologist who has an antidote, but who needs to discover a poison it can cure, Burger has an interpretation that motivates readings in which the Ethics is filled with tensions, contradictions, and radical turnarounds: for what could a work so fraught with difficultly be but a kind of dialogic conversation? It is thus no surprise that Burger asks us to judge her work "by the philosophical results it yields, in particular, the underlying argument it discloses whose movement makes the work a whole"; her fragmented Ethics cries out for wholeness. However, instead of justifying her dialogic interpretation this way, I would have preferred to hear far more about those other "philosophical results." After all, there are already a large number of scholars who have argued that the Nicomachean Ethics forms a whole; this scholarship proceeds by arguing that the various claims Aristotle makes throughout the Ethics, including those in problematic book X, are all consistent with one another. If wholeness is the main benefit we get from Burger's work, then it isn't clear why we should turn away from this established body of scholarship. On the other hand, if Burger's heuristic discloses a set of fascinating yet neglected philosophical ideas, why not have a chapter solely devoted to announcing, developing, and defending them? I would certainly want to read a work devoted to those ideas, and I am sure that other readers who find Aristotle's Dialogue with Socrates as interesting as I did would want to as well.