Aristotle's Metaphysics Alpha: Symposium Aristotelicum

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Carlos Steel (ed.), Aristotle's Metaphysics Alpha: Symposium Aristotelicum, Oxford University Press, 2012, 541pp, $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199639984.

Reviewed by André Laks, Université Paris-Sorbonne


This collection issues from the 18th Symposium Aristotelicum held in 2008 in Leuven, where first versions of all but one of the essays were presented and discussed. The first book of Aristotle's Metaphysics is certainly at least as famous as some of the others, but perhaps it is not as much read, if "read" means "read for itself" as opposed to being used for the unique information it contains about early Greek philosophy and Plato. A clear indication that this is the case is that apart from Ross' still indispensable edition and commentary of the whole of the Metaphysics, we do not have available (as far as I know) any work specifically devoted to Book A -- compare Gamma, the so called central books, Lambda, and even Beta. The present volume, which is the result of much organisation, much work, and many exchanges, now supplies this desideratum in an important way. It does not exactly constitute a "running commentary" on Book A, first because there are eleven runners (one, more or less, for each of the 10 chapters except for A9, which takes two[1]), second because not every detail of Aristotle's text is discussed (although a great number of them actually are), and third because, as is only to be expected in a collection, each chapter retains the character of an essay and accordingly remains guided by a definite question or set of questions. Still, for all the differences, the volume conveys a feeling of remarkable homogeneity. In particular, (practically) all the contributions follow the progression of Aristotle's text section by section, with adequate marking and intertitles; a personal translation of the passages commented on is more often than not given before it is commented on. Thus, the volume as a whole does function as a multi-voiced commentary and can be used as such.

Chapter 9 (on Plato's views on the formal cause) presents a distinctive outlook, both formally and from the point of view of its contents, and has always been the object of specific attention because, taken together with Alexander's commentary, it contains the basic material for reconstructing Aristotle's critique of Plato's theory of the Forms. In this case it is especially useful -- and refreshing, given the high degree of technicalities and speculation that has been put into the service of reconstructing lost or semi-lost arguments -- to have two contributions (by Dorothea Frede and Michel Crubellier) that present a clear and up-to-date overview of the whole development, accompanied by a short, but reasonably extended evaluation of each argument. Since this chapter cannot be treated independently of its retractatio and partial repetition in book M, M4-5 also get its due share of attention.

A new edition, by Oliver Primavesi, of the text of Metaphysics A follows the eleven essays. This inclusion, compared to the previous volumes in the same series, represents a formal novelty; it contributes to the unity of the volume, because decisions about the treatment of textual problems within each contribution systematically refer to Primavesi's text and sigla, whether to indicate agreement or disagreement. However, one might take two rather different points of view about its inclusion. On the one hand, this edition represents the first step towards a new edition of the whole of Aristotle's Metaphysics, destined to replace Ross' and Jaeger's (cf. Primavesi's stemmas for different parts of the Metaphysics, pp. 392ff.; for Book A-α2, where J is missing, cf. p. 397). On the other hand, it constitutes a specific contribution to the volume, one that is textually oriented but implies a number of important interpretive issues. A fair treatment of the first aspect would require an extended and technical discussion I am not in a position to deliver, for reasons of my own competence even more than of the nature of this review. But concerning the second aspect, I would say that, useful and clearly explained as the edition is (with an 80-page introduction that includes a most rewarding discussion of 23 passages ofMetaphysics A), its consultation is not exactly easy. Aristotle's Greek text is chopped into small sections immediately followed by the corresponding critical apparatus, interrupted by the precise one-by-one line numbering and by the reference before each section (from 987a6 onwards) to Averroes' so-called Textus in his Commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics (cf. p. 400), not to mention the rich apparatus -- much too rich, I think, for the purpose of the volume at hand and perhaps even for an edition of the Metaphysics in general. Fortunately, the most significant information to which the essays refer systematically, namely the question of whether a specific reading belongs to the so called alpha-tradition or to the beta-tradition, can be conveniently grasped thanks to the use of the bold letters α and β, which the reader will also find used in all the contributions.

The first book of the Metaphysics contains two main sections. The first one (A1 and 2) sketches the general outlook of an inquiry of a certain sort, which is devoted to a field of research whose object remains to be further defined. This will be the task of the following books, starting with the aporias of Book Beta, which are clearly announced in the last lines of chapter 10 -- and in some sense it emerges from what Aristotle has been doing in Metaphysics A (this is an important insight that is clearly brought out by John Cooper in his "Retrospect", pp. 351-53). In Metaphysics A, the inquiry under consideration is characterized as wisdom (sophia) and as dealing with first causes, which means, in the present case, the first causes of being and beings as such (Sarah Broadie, "A Science of First Principles" on A2, p. 65; Rachel Barney "History and Dialectic" on A3, p. 73; Cooper, who, again, rightly insists on this point, pp. 358-361). This suggests immediately that even Aristotle's reason for engaging in an exposition (and critique) of his predecessors' views from A3 to A10 cannot simply be to confirm the correctness of the doctrine of the four causes as exposited in the Physics, although this is certainly part of the project (cf. A3, 983a24-983b6, with Barney's comments p. 74; A7, 988a21-23, with Primavesi's comments in his "Second thoughts on some Presocratics", p. 226; and the initial lines of the conclusive chap. 10, with Cooper pp. 336ff.). Does the sequence followed by Aristotle have a teleological character? This is a commonly held view but it is rejected, or at least strongly nuanced, in two contributions. Stephen Menn in his "Critique of Earlier Philosophers on the Good and the Causes" (on A7 to 8, 989a18), argues that in A7 at least, Aristotle

does not say . . . that just as some people have 'touched in an obscure way' on the formal cause, so also some have 'touched in some obscure way' on the final cause. . . . but he says that earlier thinkers . . . have . . . imperfectly grasped the good, not using it as a final cause"

and interprets this in light of (and not the other way round) the sentence in A10, 993 a14, which says "in a certain sense all the [kinds of causes] have been said before" (cf. p. 210, with n. 18; and, for Menn's overall take on the matter, p. 202 and 216); and Gábor Betegh, commenting in "The Next Principle" (on A4) on Aristotle's famous metaphor at 4.985a5 (cf. 10.993a13) according to which his predecessors were "tottering," suggests that one feature of tottering is that one is uncertain as to how the sequence will end. Accordingly, "more than one line of development [scil. in the history of philosophy] was possible" (p. 106). I wonder whether this is quite consistent with the translation of psellizesthai by "express oneself in an inarticulate way" (p. 125 with n. 46), for the indistinct way in which children speak represents, surely, a certain stage within a teleological developement. Certainly, Aristotle's teleology is not of the "Panglossian" kind (Menn, p. 216); and it may be better to characterize Aristotle's story as "progressivist" rather than "deterministic" (Betegh, p. 106, with an interesting analysis of the complexities surrounding the anticipation of the efficient cause, p. 110). Still, if Aristotle's remark about philosophers being compelled by the "thing" itself (984a18) or "by the truth itself" (984b9f.) applies not only to early philosophers but also to philosophers in general, it may be difficult to deny that at least some brand of teleology plays a role in Aristotle's construct.

In any case, from A3 onwards Aristotle engages in a developmentalist view of the philosophical past, which is a totally new kind of approach. It constitutes one of the most fascinating aspects of Book A, because it implies all the basic questions about what it is to write history, especially to write the history of philosophy, and even more specifically to write the history of philosophy from a philosophical point of view. This is, understandably, a recurrent theme throughout the volume. The novelty of Aristotle's approach is enhanced by comparison with previous ways of dealing with the history of ideas, such as Hippias' "homonoetic" work, Socrates' intellectual biography in Plato's Phaedo, and the Gigantomachia in his Sophist, all texts which play an implicit but important role in Aristotle's understanding of his own enterprise (Barney p. 90 and 101 on Plato's Hippias and Sophist; Menn on Plato's Phaedo, who rightly stresses on pp. 211f. the centrality for Aristotle's own project of identifying the good as the "first principle").

The second section of Metaphysics A is itself subdivided into two sub-sections: whereas A3-A6 consists essentially in an appreciative exposition of how all four causes -- and no more than four -- gradually emerged as philosophy developed from Thales, at least, to Plato, A7-A9 engages in a critical review of what Aristotle's predecessors had to say about what the first causes of being as a whole are. Barney and Cooper engage in a discussion about whether this subsection should be taken to pertain to the same "historical" development as A3-6, or whether it belongs to another level, with its clear focus on critique, aporetical questioning, and dialectic. Barney gives a positive answer (p. 103), whereas Cooper would rather distinguish the "historical" from the "critical" enterprise (p. 359). The description that Primavesi gives of the two-step developement in his "Second thoughts on some Presocratics" (on A8, 989a18-990a32) is neutral in this respect:

Chapters 3-5 ask just one question about the earlier thinkers: can their account of ultimate causes be reduced without remainder to one or more items in Aristotle's list of causes or not. Chapter 8, on the other hand, will scrutinize the earlier thinkers in every respect which might be helpful in the search for wisdom. (p. 227)

As a matter of fact, whether one chooses to make the critical section part of the historical enterprise or not depends on how broadly one construes "history" or, more specifically, a philosophical history of philosophy. The important thing is that chapters A3-A9 constitute a remarkably well-articulated whole. This does not mean that there are not some structural problems and local difficulties, the most interesting of which result from the very complexity of Aristotle's "historical" enterprise. One aspect of this is, I think, that Aristotle's philosophical line of reconstruction of the history of philosophy, which is certainly prevalent in Metaphysics Alpha, goes along with, and to a certain degree conflicts with, a tendency towards exhaustiveness -- a tension which might be read as anticipating the difference between the two ways of conceiving the history of philosophy that is paradigmatically represented by Hegel and Zeller.

One of the great virtues of this book is that it stresses both the care with which Aristotle develops his specific project and the tensions that result -- for him and for us -- from this very complexity: What is exactly the purpose of the section on Leucippus and Democritus at 4.985b4-20 from the point of view of Aristotle's argument (Betegh, pp. 136ff.)? And "What relevance does any of this have to Aristotle's project in Metaphysics A?" asks Malcolm Schofield in his discussion of the section on the Eleatics at 5, 986b8-987b (p. 159 of his "Pythagoreanism: Emerging from the Presocratic Fog," on A5). Complementarily, how is the "mysterious" absence of Anaximander's name in the whole book to be explained (cf. Barney, p. 78, who mentions the problem, but does not really deal with it, nor does any other contribution)?[2] Still, it is pretty clear that the story told in chapters 3 and 4, where Aristotle summarizes the views of Thales, Anaxagoras, Empedocles, Democritus, and the Eleatics, and briefly mentions some other names (such as Anaximenes, Hippo, Diogenes of Apollonia, and Heraclitus) leads up to chap. 5, which, placed as it is at the center of the whole book, represents a turning point in the whole development.

As is made clear by the title of Schofield's contribution (see above), the Pythagoreans represent, in Aristotle's construction, the decisive moment in the history of philosophy, a sort of bridge between Presocratic (or rather Preplatonic) philosophy "proper" and Plato. Schofield talks about the "interstitial" character of Pythagoreanism, and it is important that, in Aristotle's presentation, chronology meets conceptual development (pp. 142f.). As a matter of fact, one can say that starting with A6, which is presented by Carlos Steel ("Plato as seen by Aristotle"), Plato will be at the center of Aristotle's attention and refutation (in A7b-A9), although the section devoted to the critique of his predecessors begins with a critique of those representatives of pre-Platonic thought who potentially have something to contribute to Aristotle's own investigation (cf. Primavesi's explanation of why Aristotle concentrates here exclusively on Empedocles, Anaxagoras, and the Pythagoreans: Philolaus', Parmenides' and Democritus' views "are simply too far off the right track" (p. 227)).

The centrality Aristotle assigns to the Pythagoreans and Plato in the history of the search for the first principles is reflected materially in his extensive critique of Plato's theory of Forms in A9. This critique is easily divided into two parts, corresponding to two versions or stages of Plato's theory of Forms, the first corresponding to its classical expositions in the dialogues, the second to the thesis that Forms are numbers. But while the division between A9a and A9b is perfectly justified and externally confirmed by the notorious fact that A9a is repeated almost word for word in M 4-5, Crubellier interestingly stresses in his contribution the continuity between the two sections of A9, read from the specific point of view of Aristotle's project in book A -- a continuity reflected in the continuous numbering of the arguments in Frede's and Crubellier's contributions (from I to VII for A9a, from VIII to XXIII for A9b; see p. 300 and the very useful Appendix I on p. 332, which provides a general plan of A9). Formally, the concision and dryness of A9b is not that different from that of A9a (Crubellier, p. 300); substantially and more importantly, whereas Aristotle's critique in M is basically of an ontological nature, A9 is directed towards Plato's metaphysical views, "in the sense of a quest for the deepest and most universal principles of natural beings and phenomena" (p. 300).

But the specific weight of chapter 9 is indicated not only by its length. The very fact that the refutation takes a systematic form (to the point that it seems to exceed the proper aim of book A) is justified if Plato, in the wake of "the Pythagoreans", has reached a decisive point: the discovery of the formal cause, which was either missed or only faintly adumbrated by his predecessors. It is true that, according to Aristotle, Plato speaks "dimly"; but, as Cooper observes, there is an important difference between speaking "dimly" and simply "lisping". Plato remains dim, according to Cooper's suggestion, because "the philosopher needs to be speaking on the basis of a fully articulated account not just of something as a cause of a given kind . . . but . . . that understanding must be grounded in a systematic, fully articulated thinking about causes in general" (p. 350). But Plato is not lisping any more, he is giving an explicit theory of the formal cause. This is enough to explain the systematic character of Aristotle's critique in A9.

Is this critique a hostile one? The question is raised by Frede, who invites us to look at it not "as a long pent up resentment against Plato's theory of Forms", but rather as "a long catalogue ofaporiai shared with certain other Platonists, as a challenge for further discussion" (p. 295). This view is tightly linked to the famous question about the degree of Aristotle's allegiance to Plato's Academy by the time he wrote Metaphysics A and the famous "we" ("we" who are Plato's disciples), which, as noted by Primavesi p. 412, appears "no less than in thirteen passages of chapter nine in our [Primavesi's] edition", and contrasts strongly with the use of the third person ("they") in the parallel passages of Book M. One might differ as to what conclusions might or should be drawn from this shift made famous by Jaeger (see Frede, pp. 269ff. and Crubellier, p. 299). But did Aristotle ever write, "as we say in the Phaedo" (hos en Phaidoni legomen)? This is the text that Primavesi prints at 991b3f. (cf. pp. 414f.), in the wake of one of Jaeger's last thoughts on the matter.[3] The reading, which obviously represents the lectio difficilior if not rather a lectio impossibilis, is not transmitted in either α or β (both of which have legetai, "he says"), but is reported by Alexander on p. 106 of his commentary (cf. also Asclepius, p. 90, 19).[4] The case is interesting not only for the history of transmission of the text, but also for the intrinsic "boldness" of the formula -- there is nothing comparable with the other first person plurals in book A, in spite of what Alexander claims. Primavesi explains: "Aristotle does not say that he has composed the Phaedo; he merely says that certain views expressed in that Platonic dialogue represent the position of a group of philosophers which Aristotle, in a sense, considers himself to be belonging to" (p. 414). Well, it seems to me that the phrase says rather more than that; if so, a problem subsists.

A critical review of the opinions of his predecessors is fairly common in Aristotle's works and represents an important aspect of his philosophical approach in general. But the review we find in Metaphysics A is unique of its kind, not least because the framework of the presentation and discussion of the various doctrines has a marked chronological component. One important aspect of Aristotle's interest in Metaphysics A is certainly the question of how exactly philosophy developed in the course of time, and many chronological remarks made in passing testify to this preoccupation. Aristotle is interested in antecedents: Homer and Hesiod vs. Thales, Hermotimus vs. Anaxagoras, Hesiod and Parmenides vs. Anaxagoras and Empedocles, Anaxagoras vs. Empedocles (on any interpretation of the controversial sentence at 984a11f., on which see Barney, p. 93, n. 61), as well as the "notoriously obscure opening words of the chapter 5" (Schofield p. 142): "Among these thinkers and before them the Pythagoreans, as they are called, latched on to mathematics" (Schofield suggests that Aristotle "means to place the later Pythagoreans among the Presocratic pluralists"). And if the sentence about the chronological relation between Alcmaeon and Pythagoras at 986a28-31 is really an addition not belonging to Aristotle's original text, as has been thought by a number of scholars (including Primavesi, who thinks that the supplement is of Neopythagorean origin, p. 447), one reason for the addition might be to pursue this line of interest. (But I think that Schofield at p. 150 is right to take it as an original remark by Aristotle).

One could wonder why this distinctive interest of Aristotle manifests itself in the case of "first philosophy" (compare the sketchy remarks about the history of dialectic in the final chapter of the Sophistical Refutations). I would suggest that this interest in chronology chimes in with and actually further develops at an ontogenetic level, so to speak, the perspective that is indicated in A1 at a quasi-phylogenetic level: man is by nature a cognitive creature. This link between the development of the human cognitive faculty and that of philosophical views and theories about causality, which bridges the two sections of Book A, (A1-2, A3-10) is not pointed to by any of the contributors, unless I missed something. But Giuseppe Cambiano ("The Desire to know," on A1) and Broadie show well how the chapters A1-A2, in spite of the similarities they display with the Protrepticus and the Ethics, launch from the start an entirely distinctive project, namely "to outline and justify a research programme concerning principles and first causes" (Cambiano, p. 41; cf. Broadie, p. 48), although both of them also make clear, in Broadie's terms, that "A1-2 is, among other things, something of a cultural manifesto, claiming the term philosophia for studies such as we get in the Metaphysics in face of Isocrates's claiming it forhis kind of activity" (p. 50, with reference to Cambiano p. 36 and 41).

As indicated above, the focus of the present volume is definitively on Aristotle's aim and strategy in dealing with his predecessors, not on using it as a source for reconstructing Presocratic (or for that matter Plato's) thought. Thus Betegh, speaking of the section devoted to the Atomists in A4: "What I am interested in now is . . . its position and function in the context of our chapter" (p. 137); or Schofield, talking about A5:

My main objective [is not] discussion in its own right of the Pythagoreanism . . . that Aristotle is reporting. The main focus will rather be on the mileage he tries to extract from these thinkers so far as his ongoing enquiry into principles and causes is concerned." (p.143)

Still, focusing on Aristotle's project not only does not prevent one from valuing him as a "source", but at times requires that one do so. Schofield's chapter is a case in point, for an essential part of it consists in vindicating Aristotle's interpretation of Philolaus (whose work is admittedly the main source of the doctrine Aristotle attributes to the first group of anonymous Pythagoreans) against that of Carl Huffman in his classic book. Whereas the latter wants to save Philolaus from taking numbers as literally constitutive of the cosmos (which is the picture that one gets from Aristotle) and thinks that Philolaus only drew a parallel between number theory and cosmology (cf. p. 155), Schofield argues on the contrary that the "fantastic" world-view which emerges from Aristotle's presentation (and is confirmed by a number of other reports) must reflect the original doctrine, and that it is precisely in this "fantasy" that Aristotle's philosophical acumen is capable of recognizing the emergence of a "self-conscious reflection about explanation" (p. 164; cf. also his comments about the relationship between the initial summary at 985b23-986a21 and Aristotle's commentary at 987a15-19, p. 163-5). And Steel's contribution is mostly driven by the question of Aristotle as a source -- in this case, as a source for our knowledge and his own knowledge -- of Plato's doctrine. His basic view, in clear reaction against both Cherniss' insistence on Aristotle's distortions and the systematic hunt for unwritten doctrines and the Pythagorization of Plato, is that apart from the doctrine of "the Great and the Small", which "seems" to be "clear evidence for an unwritten doctrine" (p. 194), Aristotle's reports on Plato in A6 are taken from or are traceable to Plato's dialogues (cf. p. 184, p. 188). Still, there are unwritten doctrines, and A9deals extensively with one of their most puzzling aspects, the thesis that Forms are numbers, of which Crubellier gives a clear-headed presentation and exegesis (pp. 303f.).

The book starts a bit abruptly, after a short formal preface by the editor, with Cambiano's analysis of A1, which is geared towards a detailed comparison between the material present in A1 and parallel developments within and outside the Aristotelian corpus (for "internal" parallels, cf. in particular the expected comparison between A1 and An. Post. II, 19, pp. 15ff.; and for external comparisons, cf. especially the 5th section "On the intellectual context of A1," pp. 26ff.). This is why I would recommend that readers -- even those who are already familiar with Book A -- start with Cooper's "Conclusion -- and Retrospect," which is explicitly dedicated to recovering the general framework of Aristotle's enterprise. Readers might then want to move on to the first section of Barney's chapter (pp. 71-76) for illuminating reflections on Aristotle's historical method, and then to Broadie's "A Science of First Principles," which fills out well the sketch given by Cooper in his "Retrospect" about Aristotle's overall project of redefining sophia.

The book is extraordinarily rich, and the reader will discover in each of its chapters much food for thinking about a great number of topics and problems that the present review could not even begin to mention. I would nevertheless like to draw attention to the fact that, apart from Primavesi's extremely important editorial contribution, which should be studied for its own sake, the reader will discover in various essays quite a few very helpful discussions and insights about textual problems:, for example, Steel's lucid exposition of the complicated problem raised by the presence of homonuma at 987b9f. (pp. 177-180); Broadie's convincing preference for thinking that what Aristotle wrote at 982b18 was "the lover of wisdom is in a way a myth lover too"(with the α tradition) rather than "the lover of myth is in a way a lover of wisdom," as printed by Ross and Jaeger and translated by many interpreters (cf. for example Ross-Barnes in the Oxford Revised Translation); or Cambiano's reasons (p. 12, n. 25) for following at 980b1 the β tradition against Primavesi's suggested correction (on the basis of Alexander's commentary).

I saw a few typographical errors, none of which is really worrying. The indices (Names, Passages, and the General Index, including important Greek words in transcription) help further, making this book an indispensable tool. [5]

[1] There is one other exception to the scheme one-chapter/one-essay: S. Menn covers chapter 7 and the beginning of 8 up to 989a18, O. Primavesi the rest of chapter 8. As in the case of the breaking up of chapter 9 into two parts, this allows a better division between the two commentators, as far as length is concerned. But there is no real internal justification for this division. As a matter of fact, the first part of chapter 8 (critique of the Monists) is also taken up in Primavesi’s contribution (pp. 225-229).   

[2] There is an ongoing debate about whether Aristotle implicitly refers to Anaximander at 7.988a29-32; cf. Menn, p. 207 with n.14.

[3] W. Jaeger, “We say in the Phaedo”, in S. Lieberman, Sh. Spiegel, L. Strauss, A. Hyman (edd.), Harry Austryn Wolfson Jubilee Volume, vol. I, Jerusalem (American Academy for Jewish Research), p. 407-21.

[4] At footnote 93, p. 414, Primavesi corrects the impression given by Jaeger on p. 408 of his article (and previously by Michael Hayduk’s apparatus in his edition of Alexander’s commentary) that two manuscripts of Aristotle also read legomen.

[5] Many thanks to Glenn W. Most for revising the English.