Aristotle's Metaphysics Book Lambda

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Frede, Michael and David Charles (eds.), Aristotle's Metaphysics Book Lambda, Symposium Aristotelicum Series, Oxford University Press, 2000, 375 pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-823764-2.

Reviewed by Christopher Shields, University of Colorado at Boulder


The twelfth book of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Metaphysics Lambda, is in several respects crucial to our understanding not only of Aristotle’s entire metaphysical system but of central developments in the subsequent history of metaphysical theology taken as a whole.

In the first instance, in terms internal to his own metaphysical schema, Metaphysics Lambda seems to answer the demand for an inquiry into immaterial substance set by Aristotle in the difficult middle books of the Metaphysics, an inquiry evidently held to be necessary for the proper understanding of such familiar sensible substances as human beings (Meta. 1028b13-15, b28-31, 1029b3-12, 1037a10-14). Metaphysics Lambda also came to acquire something of a life of its own as philosophers, beginning in late antiquity, first turned to it for guidance in metaphysical theology and then did not hesitate to appropriate features of its system, sometimes syncretically and sometimes more narrowly, wherever it suited their purposes.

This practice of looking to Metaphysics Lambda for counsel eventuated, in the thirteenth century, in the foundational Catholic philosophy of Thomas Aquinas, who openly derived central components of his own metaphysical theology directly from that book. Like other theists who have found the general philosophical features of Aristotle’s category schema and theory of substance congenial, Aquinas looked with special care at Metaphysics Lambda. This is because it is there that Aristotle argues for the existence of a separated intellectual substance, god, whose endless and complete actuality consists in pure contemplation, a substance who moves the entire cosmos without being itself in motion, moving everything instead simply by being an object of desire, or as Aristotle says, “as being loved” (Meta. 1072b3). Aristotle portrays this god as the ultimate object of study for first philosophy, which is also called by him theology and identified as the most elevated branch of human inquiry (Meta. 1026a18-34).

Given the importance of Metaphysics Lambda for our understanding of Aristotle and for those who made use of his views, we may welcome the current anthology of papers, all revisions of presentations at the Tenth Symposium Aristotelicum, held in Oxford in 1996. The proceedings as we have them are non-standard, relative to other numbers in the continuing volumes produced from the Symposium Aristotelicum. Instead of commissioning a series of explorations organized around a text or topic, the conveners of the conference elected to focus minutely on the text of Lambda chapter by chapter and so have produced a volume which serves as a kind of de facto commentary by many different hands. Each of Lambda’s ten chapters receives a careful analysis by a noted expert on Aristotle, with the exception of the crucial Lambda 9, the chapter in which Aristotle characterizes his god’s seamless activity. This chapter merits two separate complementary treatments, the first a running commentary in the style of the other chapters and the second, by A. Kosman, an exploration of god’s endless contemplative activity. In addition to these eleven papers, one of the volume’s editors supplies a discursive overview of the whole of Lambda, unfortunately calibrated to neither the expert nor the student.

The volume will stimulate the interest of Aristotelian scholars, for whom it is primarily intended. Readers without a prior familiarity with Metaphysics Lambda will probably not be in a position to benefit from the individual commentaries, since they for the most part presuppose an understanding of Greek as well as of the basics of Aristotelian metaphysics. Scholars in the field will, though, find a wealth of information in these chapters. Indeed, every single commentary is well worth studying. So, all those pursuing advanced work on individual passages in Metaphysics Lambda will certainly want to consult the relevant discussions in this volume. They will also, however, want to continue working with more unified treatments, including W. D. Ross’s monumental two-volume Oxford commentary of 1924, which offers a more synoptic view of Lambda’s role in Aristotle’s Metaphysics.

In his introduction to the volume, M. Frede exhorts its readers, at least those who care about Aristotelian philosophy for its own sake, to work hard to set aside the accretions of tradition in order to recover what is authentically Aristotelian: “As Aristotelian scholars we do not want to continue to keep the fictional Aristotle of philosophical tradition alive, by updating his picture according to the latest insights of our philosophical and classical colleagues; we want to know what Aristotle actually thought and what we are to make of what he thought” (p. 52). However laudatory we may regard the goal of understanding Aristotle in his own terms, little argument from Frede actually supports the judgment that the Aristotle of philosophical tradition is “fictional”. Presumably, he means that several (all?) of the interpretations and appropriations of Lambda from late antiquity through Aquinas and beyond are incorrect or are, at the very least, serious distortions of Aristotle’s actual meaning.

This is a surprising claim, one to some degree undercut by another theme of Frede’s introduction, a theme also echoed in various ways by many of the other contributors to this volume, to the effect that very little can be known with security regarding Lambda. Indeed, not much about Lambda is beyond scholarly controversy: we do not know its date of composition (some think of it as an early composition superseded by Aristotle’s mature theory of substance, as adumbrated in the difficult middle books of the Metaphysics, while others, including Ross, contend that it is “rightly regarded as the coping-stone of the Metaphysics” ); we do not know whether it was written as an independent treatise only later fitted in the Metaphysics by Aristotle or by a later editor; the work is plainly lacking in internal continuity, with the result that at times it appears to be a bit of an unfinished patchwork; individual chapters present difficulties of internal coherence and continuity; and the meanings of its central doctrines concerning god’s intellectual activity are as hotly disputed now as they have been throughout the tradition. Consequently, it is a bit difficult to know how to return to Aristotle’s text without first coming to terms with the productions of those in the tradition who have come before us. Are we, for example, to set aside the painstaking stylometric analyses of the text of Lambda as the fodder of fiction? Presumably not. But then why should we not avail ourselves as well of Aquinas’ incisive commentaries? Why, at any rate, suppose in advance that the portrait we encounter there, or in the earlier tradition of Greek commentators, is somehow inaccurate or otherwise fictional?

Moreover, it is hardly the case that the contributors to the volume find reason to separate themselves from the tradition of interpretation and exploration as it has come down to us. Noteworthy in this regard is Kosman’s engaging excursus on divine thought, which evidently understands itself to be very much part of a tradition. Kosman concludes, for instance, that “[I]t is no anachronism to suggest as I am that Aristotle’s notion of thought’s self-cognition is the forerunner of these notions of a self-awareness which, without being a standard instance of it, explains intentional consciousness.” Here it is relevant that “these notions” are just those identified by Kosman as having been introduced by Brentano, whose views are, again according to Kosman, more closely akin to Aristotle than those of Sartre, since Brentano distinguishes between two modes of conscious awareness, Wahrnehmung and Beobachtung, whereas Sartre removes the self from its own scope in insisting that “consciousness is not for itself its object.” (p. 324). We may or may not wish to dispute Kosman’s contentions; but we may also wonder whether his frank affirmation of the tradition-colored character of his exploration of Aristotle’s conception of the divinity of thought should be regarded problematic merely as such. We may also, by the same token, wonder whether it is unavoidable or even undesirable to proceed as Kosman does. Kosman, at any rate, seems happy to count himself among the ranks of Aristotelian scholars, and it is difficult to fault him for doing so.

These remarks suggest one way in which the volume lacks cohesion of the sort expected from a continuous commentary or a scholarly monograph, conceived and executed by a single scholar with a unified hermeneutical methodology. Still, if this is a weakness of the volume, it is also one of its impressive strengths: the variety of perspectives present in the individual chapter commentaries jointly illuminate facets of Metaphysics Lambda in ways unlikely to be equaled by even the most creative and broadly educated individual Aristotelian scholar. In this respect, this volume presents a fascinating variety of approaches well worth consulting as scholars continue to grapple with Lambda’s striking metaphysical theology.