Aristotle's Modal Syllogistic

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Marko Malink, Aristotle's Modal Syllogistic, Harvard University Press, 2013, 366pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674724549.

Reviewed by Jacob Rosen, Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin


This is a terrific book, which makes definite advances in the understanding of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic and of his non-modal syllogistic as well. It is very elegant, relative to the complexity of the material. Thanks to the carefully structured prose discussion in front and the collection of tables for reference in the back, a reader can gain a systematic grasp of Aristotle’s commitments, the relations among them, and the prospects for a coherent interpretation of what Aristotle was up to. Moreover, the book develops a novel semantics for the sentences treated by Aristotle’s modal syllogistic, according to which surprisingly many of Aristotle’s claims come out true. This book deserves careful study by anyone with an interest in the history of logic. For researchers on Aristotle’s Analytics, it will be an indispensable resource.

Aristotle’s modal syllogistic, contained in Prior Analytics chapters 1.3 and 8-22, lies at the intersection of two of his great philosophical legacies. It belongs to the Prior Analytics, which is the founding text of formal logic. And it systematically considers how to reason about necessity and possibility, a question which Aristotle was the first thinker to tackle seriously and which he treated from different angles in different texts. Thus the modal syllogistic stands in connection with the assertoric syllogistic on the one hand (Pr. An. 1.1-2 and 4-7), and with various texts about necessity, possibility, and capacities on the other (for example, Metaph. IX). It is an extremely difficult text. If we can make sense of it, it should yield valuable information about Aristotle’s conception(s) of modality and about his approach(es) to language and logic.

Chapters 1.3 and 8-22 of the Prior Analytics are messy and complicated. There are mistakes and contradictions, which no interpretation can get around, short of introducing grave ambiguities and equivocations into the text. (If I am not mistaken, Aristotle has contradicted himself by the end of chapter 1.9, scarcely halfway through his discussion of inferences involving necessity-sentences.[1])

Nevertheless, Marko Malink shows how to mine a consistent theory out of these chapters. He identifies a set of claims that are (a) delimited in a principled way and (b) plausibly regarded as the meat of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic. In Malink’s words, these are ‘all of Aristotle’s claims about the validity and invalidity of inferences in the modal syllogistic’ (p. 2). I will say more in a moment about which claims are included and excluded by this description (the description may be slightly misleading).

Malink shows that this limited set of claims is consistent. He does this by providing an interpretation of their subject matter on which all the claims are true. More precisely, he provides two such interpretations: a weaker one in the appendix and a stronger one in the main text.

An example of a difference between Malink’s two interpretations is that under the stronger interpretation, Barbari XNN is valid, while under the weaker one it is invalid.[2] Aristotle himself does not seem to take a view about Barbari XNN, which has the form ‘A applies to all B; B necessarily applies to all C; therefore A necessarily applies to some C’.

Which exactly of Aristotle’s claims is Malink’s interpretation designed to make true?

The modal syllogistic is a theory about entailment relations among sixteen types of sentence. The sentences in question each contain two terms, one of which is said to apply (or not apply) to the other in some way. The sixteen types of sentence result from different combinations of quantity (universal or particular), quality (affirmative or negative), and modality (necessity, possibility [to the exclusion of necessity], possibility [perhaps including necessity], or absence of modal qualification). Examples: ‘swift applies to all horses’, ‘asleep possibly applies to some horse’, ‘swan necessarily applies to no horse.’ In the course of the chapters on modal syllogisms, Aristotle says various sorts of things about these sentences. These include:

Elucidations: Remarks about what a given type of sentence means. These are rare and not very informative.

Examples: Examples of concrete terms that yield a true, or false, sentence of a given type.

Conversion claims: Claims to the effect that a given sentence entails a corresponding sentence with the terms exchanged. For example, he claims:

‘A necessarily applies to no B’ entails ‘B necessarily applies to no A’.

Claims of validity and invalidity: Claims to the effect that a given pair of sentences (the premises) entails, or does not entail, a third sentence (the putative conclusion). These include:

A) Syllogistic-style arguments: In most cases, the premises and putative conclusion conform to a certain pattern — one of Aristotle’s ‘three figures’ — in which the two premises have a term in common and the putative conclusion contains the remaining two terms. For example, Aristotle claims:

‘A necessarily applies to no B’ and
‘B applies to all C’ entail:
‘A necessarily applies to no C’

B) Nonsyllogistic-style arguments: In the course of discussing syllogistic-style arguments, Aristotle sometimes makes claims about sentence triplets that do not conform to the syllogistic pattern. For example, he claims:

‘A applies to all B’ and
‘B necessarily applies to all C’ do not entail:
‘A necessarily applies to some B’.

This is not a syllogistic-style argument, because the putative conclusion contains the shared term B rather than containing both non-shared terms, A and C.

Malink’s interpretation is designed to validate Aristotle’s claims of validity and invalidity of syllogistic-style arguments, as well as his conversion claims.

The remaining sorts of claims are allowed to fall out as they may. Thus, not all of Aristotle’s examples turn out correct: on some occasions, Aristotle claims that a given pair of terms yields a true (false) sentence of a given type although, under Malink’s interpretation, the sentence in question is false (true). Similarly, some of Aristotle’s claims of invalidity of nonsyllogistic-style arguments come out false. For example, under Malink’s interpretation, ‘A applies to all B’ and ‘B necessarily applies to all C’ entail ‘A necessarily applies to some B’, contrary to what Aristotle says. (There is good reason for this; see note 1.)

In Malink’s interpretations, the meaning of a sentence in Aristotle’s modal syllogistic does not result in any straightforward, compositional way from the meanings of constituents such as ‘necessarily’, ‘some’, and ‘not’. Instead, Malink’s approach is holistic: the sixteen types of sentence contain sixteen different complex copulae, and each copula is given an interpretation as a whole package.

The interpretations are built out of three primitive relations between terms, called ‘aX-predication’, ‘aN-predication’, and ‘strong aN-predication’. These three relations are governed by a handful of simple axioms (ax1-ax6, p. 287) and, in the main-text version of Malink’s interpretations, a number of additional theses as well (S1-25, pp. 116-159).

Sentences are interpreted in terms of more or less complicated constructions out of the three primitive relations. Starting with the simplest cases, ‘A applies to all B’ is true iff A is aX-predicated of B, and ‘A necessarily applies to all B’ is true iff A is aN-predicated of B.

‘A necessarily holds of some B’ is true iff either A is aN-predicated of something of which B is aX-predicated, or A is aX-predicated of something of which B is aN-predicated.

Other cases are increasingly complex.

For several types of sentence, especially those involving possibility, Malink acknowledges that his interpretations are artificial. They do not represent what the sentences in question really mean in the context of Aristotle’s theory, and they do not fully explain why Aristotle made the claims of validity and invalidity that he made. Still, Malink is right to insist on the usefulness of his interpretations. Most obviously, they serve to show that Aristotle’s claims are consistent. Moreover, they may explain some aspects of Aristotle’s thinking about the sentences in question without explaining all aspects. And they can provide the basis for a future compromise. We could give simpler and more natural interpretations to the sentences of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic, but, as a cost, we would have to write off some of his validity- and invalidity-claims as mistakes. Before settling on such a compromise, it is extremely useful to see, in detail, exactly what an uncompromising interpretation looks like.

For other parts of the modal syllogistic, Malink defends his interpretations as true accounts of the meanings of the sentences that Aristotle’s theory is about. Malink’s defense employs ideas about terms and predication, which he extracts from the Topics. The treatment of the Topics is very interesting and provocative. It should be read cautiously: perhaps everything Malink says is right, but at present I am unsure. Regardless, it is an enlightening read. Malink has reasons for everything he says, and when one disagrees, the disagreement is sure to be productive.

Malink finds in the Topics a distinction between three types of term. There are two types of what he calls essence terms: namely, substance terms (such as ‘Socrates’, ‘animal’, and ‘horse’) and nonsubstance essence terms (such as ‘color’ and ‘whiteness’: roughly, names of attributes). Essence terms come in genus-species trees: for example, animal is a genus of horse, and color is a genus of whiteness. Third, there are what Malink calls nonessence terms, such as ‘colored’ and ‘white’: roughly, adjectives. Nonessence terms, unlike their nominalized correlates, do not stand in genus-species relations. (Color is a genus of whiteness, but colored is not a genus of white.)

Malink maintains two key theses about these types of terms. The first thesis is that essence terms apply necessarily to anything they apply to. Part of the idea is that an essence term, such as ‘redness’, cannot be used to say that an attribute inheres in a subject. Only the correlated nonessence terms fulfill that function. For example, the fact that all fire hydrants are red is expressed by the sentence ‘red applies to all fire hydrants’, and not by the sentence ‘redness applies to all fire hydrants’. In this sort of way, essence terms are barred from serving as predicates in true contingent predicative statements. They are confined to such truths as ‘redness applies to all (shades of) scarlet’, cases where the corresponding necessity-sentence (e.g., ‘redness necessarily applies to all [shades of] scarlet’) is also true.

The second thesis is that whenever ‘A necessarily applies to all B’ is true, B is an essence term. The thought is that necessity is grounded in essence in such a way that a subject of necessary universal predication must have an essence.

Taken together, these two theses can explain several of Aristotle’s claims about inferences involving necessity-sentences. Most centrally, they yield an explanation of Aristotle’s endorsement of Barbara NXN, that is, his claim that

‘A necessarily applies to all B’ and
‘B applies to all C’ entail
‘A necessarily applies to all C’.

Malink’s explanation goes like this. Given that A necessarily applies to all B, the second thesis implies that B is an essence term. Given that B is an essence term and that B applies to all C, the first thesis implies that B necessarily applies to all C. (NB: ‘B necessarily applies to all C’ is not a further assumption or ‘shadow premise’ in Malink’s explanation. It is a consequence of the two original premises along with general theses about essence terms and nonessence terms.) Now we have ‘A necessarily applies to all B’ and ‘B necessarily applies to all C’, and it is plausible to hold that these entail ‘A necessarily applies to all C’.

Malink does an ingenious job at finding evidence for his explanation in Aristotle’s Topics. On the other hand, his account is liable to objections. There is not space to weigh the evidence here. I am uncertain whether Malink’s readings of the Topics are all ultimately justified, and whether his explanation of Barbara NXN should be accepted.

One point to mention is that Malink has no direct textual evidence for his second thesis (p. 126). Malink draws support from other commentators, but I am not sure those commentators endorse precisely the thesis required by Malink’s account. The appeal to Kit Fine (1994) seems misplaced: according to Fine, every necessity has a source in some essence or other, but this does not imply that the subject of predication has an essence in every true predicative necessity-sentence. (Fine himself warns against confusing subject and source of necessity.[3])

Malink’s semantics yield some counter-intuitive results. In many cases, he shows that the result is entailed by Aristotle’s system of validity- and invalidity-claims; no interpretation can validate those claims without yielding the strange result. Some other cases are special to Malink’s semantics. It is important to be aware of these oddities when we weigh the costs and benefits of Malink’s interpretation. Here are a few examples.

In Malink’s main-text interpretation, if ‘A applies to some B’ is true and B is a substance term, then ‘A necessarily applies to some B’ will be true.[4] For example, since ’some humans are smoking’ is true and ‘human’ is a substance term, ‘necessarily, some humans are smoking’ is true.

For some pairs of terms, both ‘A necessarily applies to all B’ and ‘A possibly belongs to no B’ (along with ‘A possibly does not belong to some B’ are true. Malink shows that this is required by Aristotle’s claims of validity and invalidity (pp. 201 ff.). In Malink’s semantics, such pairs of terms are especially easy to come by: one may take any two nonsubstance essence terms which stand to each other as genus to species.[5] For example, both ‘color necessarily belongs to all whiteness’ and ‘color possibly belongs to no whiteness’ are true.

On Malink’s interpretation, there is a systematic ambiguity in Aristotle’s use of the sentence type ‘A necessarily applies to all B’. Within descriptions of syllogistic-style arguments it means one thing (and, as noted above, it is compatible with ‘A possibly does not belong to some B’). But it has a different meaning in other contexts, when Aristotle gives counterexamples to show that a given pair of premises does not yield any syllogistic-style conclusion. In these other contexts, ‘A necessarily applies to all B’ expresses the contradictory of ‘A possibly does not belong to some B’ (p. 213).

Malink takes an extremist approach to his subject matter. Within the modal syllogistic, he accommodates Aristotle’s claims of validity and invalidity of syllogistic-style arguments while making other parts of the text (e.g., Aristotle’s examples and proofs) house all the errors. His treatment of the Topics is also one-sided in certain ways. For example, he tends to focus on the asserted content of passages while downplaying their pragmatic implicature. (An example of this is Malink’s use of Top. 4. 2, 122a10-17 in support of his theses S6 and S7. This passage of the Topics carries, I think, an implicature that goes against Malink’s thesis S3. This is worrying because Malink’s explanation of Barbara NXN relies on the conjunction of S3 and S7.)

Some readers will embrace Malink’s interpretation as it stands — it may, after all, be the best one currently going. Even moderates should see that in many ways the book’s extremism enhances its value, rather than detracting from it. A fully balanced treatment of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic would have to weigh and compromise among so many conflicting factors that it would quickly become bewildering. Malink chooses a method and follows it with tremendous precision, ingenuity, and explicitness. By doing this, he provides an extraordinarily useful point of orientation for any interpreter. Just as the location of a circle’s circumference allows us to find its center, Malink’s extreme interpretation, well developed and expounded as it is, can help us construct the best possible moderate one.

Besides, Malink establishes positive results that any interpretation must accommodate. It is very interesting, even astonishing, to learn that there are no contradictions among Aristotle’s claims of validity and invalidity of syllogistic-style arguments. How did Aristotle manage this? The most exciting possibility is that his claims reflect a coherent conception of modality-cum-quantification, an unfamiliar conception which no interpreter has recognized before now. On balance this seems unlikely, given the sorts of oddities mentioned above and the problems that come along once we take into account Aristotle’s supporting examples and proofs. But is it purely a matter of luck, then? Or did Aristotle have a method for tracking relations among syllogistic moods by which he could assure consistency in this domain?


On page 276 (Appendix A), in the second row from the bottom (‘AeB BoC AoC’), the Bekker page number ‘35b30’ should be removed from columns ‘NQM and ‘NQX.

On page 333 (Appendix C), ‘animal-awake’ is listed as ‘not oM’, but according to page 218 it is an example of an a­X-proposition.

[1] Aristotle claims that AaB, BaNC do not entail AiNB (1. 9, 30a25–7). But other things he says imply that such an entailment holds: namely, he endorses Darii NXN (1. 9, 30a37–40) and, apparently, Barbara XNX (1. 9, 30a23–5); he says that AiNB converts to BiNA (1. 3, 25a32) and that AaB converts to BiA (1. 2, 25a17). Here is a derivation from AaB, BaNC to AiNB: (1) AaB; (2) BaNC; (3) AaC (from 1, 2, Barbara XNX); (4) CiA (from 3, a-conversion); (5) BiNA (from 2, 4, Darii NXN); (6) AiNB (from 5, iN-conversion).

[2] Here is a derivation that is valid in the main text interpretation: (1) AaXB; (2) BaNC; (3) BaXC (from 2, ax5); (4) AaXC (from 1, 3, Barbara XXX); (5) CaNC (from 2, S21 [p. 140]); (6) AiNC (from 4, 5, Darapti XNN). Step 5 of this derivation is invalid in the appendix interpretation, which does not include S21. For the appendix interpretation we may offer the following countermodel. The domain is {a, b, c}; b is aN-predicated and strongly aN-predicated of c; a is aX-predicated of b, b of c, a of c, and each object of itself. This model satisfies ax1–ax6. It makes AaxB and BaNC true while making AiC false.

[3] Kit Fine, ‘Essence and Modality’, Philosophical Perspectives 8 (1994), pp. 1-16 at p. 9.

[4] Here is a derivation: (1) AiXB; (2) B is a substance term; (3) AaXZ and BaXZ (from 1, semantics of iX, existential instantiation); (4) substance terms are aN-predicated of everything of which they are aX-predicated (p. 152); (5) AaXZ and BaNZ (from 2, 3, 4); (6) AiNB (from 5, semantics of iN).

[5] On the one hand, since A is a genus of B, A is essentially predicated of B, and so AaNB (S10, p. 125). On the other hand, since neither term is a substance term, A is not N-bar-predicated of B (see (dfN-bar), p. 287) and so AoMB. Also, B is not aX-predicated of any substance terms (see S24, p. 151), so A is not N-bar-predicated of anything of which B is aX-predicated, so AeMB. (See the semantics of oM and eM on p. 288.)