Aristotle's Politics: Living Well and Living Together

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Eugene Garver, Aristotle's Politics: Living Well and Living Together, University of Chicago Press, 2011, 300pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226284026.

Reviewed by Bernard Yack, Brandeis University


Many of us in the humanities and social sciences like to say that our teaching plays an indispensable role in our research. Some of us even believe it, rather than merely repeat a commonplace that displays our high regard for what we do in the classroom. But very few of us produce scholarship that reflects our teaching experience. The issues that we explore in our publications are far more likely to come from the last round of journal articles than from the questions posed by intelligent students.

Eugene Garver is one of the rare scholars who practices what we so often preach about the close connection between teaching and research. More important, he is one of the even rarer scholars whose work clearly demonstrates the value of that preaching. Not that Garver ignores the increasingly interesting scholarship on Aristotle's political philosophy that has been produced over the last thirty years -- as is clear from the fifty plus pages of endnotes in which he engages his fellow academics. It is rather that the questions that he poses in this study of the Politics seem more like the ones that would be raised by a group of intelligent undergraduates trying to make sense of this strange book than by scholars struggling with the latest arguments of Aristotle's interpreters and critics. Proceeding in this way allows Garver to get behind and correct a number of pre-conceptions that shape our appropriation of Aristotle's ideas about political life, thereby producing a book equally useful to students and Aristotle scholars.

Consider, for example, one of his main themes, Aristotle's understanding of the relationship between political philosophy, practical judgment, and political action. Philosophy, Garver insists, has a far greater role to play in politics than in ethics, according to Aristotle; in other words, it has more to teach us about how to live together than how to act well. This claim runs counter to the common understanding of Aristotle's practical philosophy -- and not only because the philosophic literature dealing with Aristotelian ethics is so much larger and more prestigious than that dealing with Aristotelian politics. Specifically political problems seem so much more mundane and instrumental than those that drive ethical reflection, calculations about how to broker agreements or write laws as opposed to speculations about the nature of happiness and the good. Moreover, they seem much more dependent on the contingencies of time and place than the enduring concerns of ethics, a point that, Garver recalls, Mortimer Adler used to emphasize in the lectures that introduced him to Aristotelian philosophy.

But if you look at the two books, the Politics and the Nicomachean Ethics, from the intelligent student's perspective, just trying to make sense of what Aristotle puts on the page, Garver's claim isn't counter-intuitive at all. For Aristotle tells you right at the beginning of the Ethics that philosophy is not going to teach anyone how to be ethical, that he is writing for people already disposed by good education to seek happiness through a life of active virtue. In the Politics, however, he repeatedly notes that statesmen need philosophy to help them solve their problems. Given our preconceptions about the relative remoteness of politics from philosophy, that may sound a little bit like special pleading, a bit of rhetoric designed to raise the dignity of the mundane issues of political life. But drop these preconceptions and look at the text with the intelligent students' eyes and other ways of thinking about the relationship between politics and ethics emerge.

Philosophy plays a greater role in political action, Garver suggests, because you need to understand more about the nature of things to make it possible for us to live well together than to live well on our own. The just individual does not have to understand the nature of justice in order to do the right thing, according to Aristotle. But the statesman who tries to construct a lasting order among rich and poor will have to understand something about the nature of justice and why different sorts of people tend to grasp different parts of it. Moreover, he will have to understand a lot about human nature, about what brings us together into communities and what makes communal life so difficult to maintain, if he wants to make the right choices. Ironically, it is precisely the worldliness of politics, its roots in the contingencies that connect and disconnect us, that makes philosophical knowledge of value for those who practice it.

Another key point on which Garver's approach helps correct widespread misimpressions of Aristotelian ideas concerns questions about ethical and political pluralism. Because Aristotle denies the key premise of most modern versions of pluralism, the equal value of different understanding of the human good, it seems very hard to see him as anything but an enemy of political pluralism. This is, nonetheless, not the fanatical monist that Plato is so often taken for, but a powerful foil for a pluralistic understanding of politics. Aristotle provides us with a singular understanding of human flourishing and tells us that the purpose of politics is to help us flourish in this way. His political philosophy therefore seems to leave room for only one correct vision of political order, however difficult or unlikely it may be to realize in the world.

Unfortunately, this singular and substantive vision of correct political order cannot be found in the Politics. Indeed, we do not even get a determinate answer to the fundamental question of political justice: who should rule? Much is said about the different contributions and claims of the virtuous, the wealthy, and the free. But nothing is settled. If anything, it looks like Aristotle has a far less singular and determinate understanding of political justice than his modern liberal counterparts. This is plain to any intelligent student struggling through the text for the first time. It certainly was to me. But like most students, I assumed that I must be missing something because I was taught that Aristotle, as a defender of natural right and natural law, was a proponent of the kind of singular and substantive understanding of political order that modern liberals sought to overthrow.

Rather than spin ingenious interpretations that bring Aristotle's text into line with our preconceptions about him, Garver suggests that we should build on what we find there and correct our preconceptions -- our preconceptions about pluralism, as well as about Aristotle. Aristotle, it seems, is a kind of political pluralist. Indeed, in many ways he is much more open to political diversity than his modern counterparts. But his pluralism takes an unfamiliar form.

Currently we assume a plurality of ways of living well with the function of politics to coordinate these differences with a modus vivendi, overlapping consensus, neutral framework, or public reason. In the Ethics Aristotle presents a single good practical life, while in the Politics offers a diversity of possible ways communities can organize themselves to live well. . . . Our emphasis on moral diversity has led to a search for political unanimity and neutrality. Aristotle's emphasis on a single best life leads him, in on the contrary, to a greater openness to political diversity than we see today. . . . We find ethics and the good life the place for diversity, and politics the place for uniformity, while for Aristotle it's the other way around (66).

In other words, modern pluralists seek acceptance for the singular, if minimal understanding of justice that will best enable us to pursue our different understandings of happiness, while Aristotle seeks to identify the various ways in which different kinds of political institutions can help us achieve his singular understanding of a good human life. Aristotle's failure to pin down a determinate understanding of political justice in Book Three of the Politics -- or anywhere else for that matter -- is no accident. Instead, it reflects his rejection of the assumption held by his modern critics that singular understandings of human flourishing entail commitments to singular understandings of justice. It is modern pluralists, not Aristotle, who are obsessed with pinning down such an understanding of justice.

Garver ably reconstructs this Aristotelian alternative to modern conceptions of pluralism. He does not suggest that we abandon our conception for Aristotle's. But he does point out ways in which familiarity with Aristotle's conception might temper the illiberality sometimes inspired by our combination of diverse understandings of the good with the pursuit of singular understandings of justice. It's not just the impositions and sleights of hand by which agreement about our understanding of justice is established -- as when Rawlsians insist that we really agree with ideas about justice that we think that we reject. It's also the invitation to despotism opened up by the assumption that commitments to singular understandings of the good entail commitments to singular visions of political order.

The liberal idea that disagreement about the good is the reason to make the right prior to the good, assumes that if, on the contrary, one could affirm the nature of the good without dissent, then politics must be built on that foundation. The function of politics would therefore be to enforce and instantiate that good. There are then two kinds of politics, liberalism, and an alternative that could be called either perfectionism or totalitarianism. This seems to me to be a false and unhealthy opposition. Aristotle shows us how to do better (70).

In the end, however, there are some costs to Garver's less academic approach to interpretation. Starting with the perspective of the intelligent student's struggle to make sense of a difficult text is a good way to identify and correct widely shared academic misconceptions. But it also inevitably slights issues and concepts that do not jump off the page at you, issues whose significance requires considerable academic sophistication to recognize. I am thinking of a notion like Aristotle's concept of "general justice" or lawfulness, developed in Book Five of the Ethics. Since it is not emphasized and does not correspond to much in modern thinking about justice, it is easy for well-educated scholars, let alone intelligent students, to pass over. But there is good reason to believe that Aristotle has this concept of justice in mind throughout the Politics, and that it can help us explain any number of anomalies in the text: for example, the relationship between justice and stability, an issue that Garver explores in depth, but less successfully, in my opinion, than he does other issues. When making sense of older and foreign texts, one has to think through, articulate, and apply the things that an author takes for granted as well as the things that he or she throws in your face. No doubt, doing so makes us more vulnerable to the kinds of academic misconceptions that Garver's approach helps us correct. But we have to risk such misconceptions if we want access to the most unique and interesting things that these books can teach us.

I have no doubt Garver would agree and acknowledge that such limits are built into every useful approach to interpretation. But since his approach is rarely pursued -- and even more rarely pursued so well -- I am inclined to celebrate his book's achievements rather than dwell very long on its limitations. For it serves his "modest" goals extremely well: to teach us "something not only about Aristotle's thought but also about the problems of living together" (1).