Aristotle's Psychology of Signification

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Simon Noriega-Olmos, Aristotle's Psychology of Signification: A Commentary on De Interpretatione 16a3-18, De Gruyter, 2013, $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110287653.

Reviewed by David Charles, Oriel College, University of Oxford


Simon Noriega-Olmos aims to challenge a traditional line of interpretation of Aristotle's remarks in De Interpretatione 1 and to suggest an alternative which is 'entirely coherent, rich in philosophical insight and Aristotelian in spirit' although 'not fully compatible with the common modern understanding of signification.' (p. 2). While Noriega-Olmos discusses Aristotle's remarks on vocalized sound, signs and convention in other passages, his attention is directed mainly on five key lines near the beginning of this chapter.

A neutral, but somewhat uninformative, translation of these lines might be:

The primary items of which vocalized sounds and written letters are signs are the same affections of the soul for everybody and what they [the affections] are likenesses of are then things. These matters have been treated in the discussion on the soul.

The traditional interpretation, which Noriega-Olmos considers, presents Aristotle as committing himself to three claims:

(a) A two-step account of the relation of signification: the first step relates linguistic expressions to affections in the soul, the second thoughts to external objects. Linguistic expressions signify external objects [non-accidentally] in virtue of being signs for thoughts, which are likenesses of external objects.

(b) A view about the relevant objects: all thoughts are likenesses of external 'concrete' objects (to use Noriega-Olmos' terminology).

(c) A photographic view of likeness: the likeness relation is one in which thoughts are mental-photographic representations of external objects of this type.

Traditional interpreters offer the following translation/ paraphrase of the relevant lines:

What vocalized sounds and written letters are signs of -- the first members of the sequence relevant to signification -- these are the same affections for all, and what these affections are likenesses of are only then and not before [as next members of the sequence relevant to signification] things [external objects].

Noriega-Olmos disputes each of the three claims. He rejects (b), suggesting that the objects of which thoughts are likenesses need not be external 'concrete' objects but can be forms of external objects, abstract entities (e.g., numbers, virtue, etc), non-existent entities such as goat-stag, and states of affairs such as those indicated by verbs (e.g., to walk) (p. 125). He rejects (c), claiming that thoughts are likenesses of their objects in virtue of having something in common with them (p. 115). What they share, in his view, is the formal aspect of their objects (e.g., what those objects primarily and fundamentally are (p.132) -- the essence or unchanging reality of the object in question (p. 127). In arguing against (c), he criticizes the traditional view for not taking seriously Aristotle's reference to De Anima, where -- according to Noriega-Olmos -- he develops the idea that thoughts 'are formally the same as the formal aspects [or essences] of their objects' (p. 132). Finally, Noriega-Olmos rejects (a), suggesting that, for Aristotle, linguistic expressions signify (non-accidentally) only thoughts and not the objects of which those thoughts are likenesses. What they signify is the instantiation in our souls (intellects) of the form, or essence, of the object in question (which may be a 'concrete' object but could be (e.g.) a goatstag) (p. 133). The forms instantiated in our soul are primary entities (or 'primordials', as Noriega-Olmos frequently calls them) because they play a basic, or fundamental, ontological role as the essences of the entities in question.

Noriega-Olmos offers, on this basis, an alternative translation/ paraphrase of the key lines:

The primary objects (or primordials) of which vocalized sounds and written letters are signs are the same affections for all, and the things of which these affections are likenesses are indeed the same for all.

According to his interpretation, Aristotle proposes

(a)   A one-step account of signification: linguistic expressions relate (non-accidentally) only to affections of the soul: i.e., thoughts;

(b)  A more liberal view of the relevant objects: the objects with whose forms the thoughts in question are (qualitatively) identical include 'concrete', abstract and non-existent objects, and states of affairs;

(c)   An alternative view of likeness: thoughts are likenesses of objects in that they have the same formal aspects as those things.

In his account, linguistic expressions signify (non-accidentally) those contents of our thoughts that have the same formal aspects as the things of which they are likenesses. What is signified (non-accidentally) by linguistic expressions (in this interpretation) are forms of objects (primary or 'primordial' objects) as instantiated in our thoughts.

Noriega-Olmos departs from the traditional view (as he presents it) at two basic points:

(1) He understands likeness with a thing (in (c)) in terms not of being a photograph of but as having the same formal aspects as the object in question.

(2) He claims that the only (non-accidental) objects of signification are the contents of our thoughts: the formal aspects of things that are instantiated in our minds. There are no non-accidental objects of signification beyond our minds. There is a one-step account of signification.

While Noriega-Olmos has written an interesting and thought provoking study, the considerations he adduces in favour of these two contentions are, in my view, not compelling, in no small measure because he fails to consider the variety of two-step interpretations, both ancient and modern, that have been proposed. I shall focus on his two central claims, pointing to issues which he, or others, might profitably consider in developing further an account of the type he proposes.

(1) The likeness relation

No doubt some two-step interpreters have made the two assumptions Noriega-Olmos notes:

(i) Thoughts are likenesses of objects in being photographic representations of external objects, and

(ii) All thoughts are likenesses of external objects.

But not all have done so. It may be helpful to recall the range of two-stage interpretations on offer.

With regard to (i): some two-step interpreters have explicitly rejected the photographic model and proposed detailed alternatives. For some, while thoughts are likenesses of objects in virtue of being in some way like those objects, the relevant mode of similarity is not visual. On this view, Aristotle's talk of thought taking on the form of the object rests on his commitment to the presence of an intentional (mind-dependent) entity which -- in some way -- represents the mind-independent object in question. The mind-dependent entity is like the external one in that it possesses some features which are -- in some way -- a representation of it. Such interpreters could agree with Noriega-Olmos that the content of our thought shares formal features with the object it represents, which are (in some way) abstracted from perceptual data. Commentators from Aquinas to Deborah Modrak,

Christopher Shields and Victor Caston have attempted to specify what is involved in this process, some presenting imagination as having the role of converting perceptual into intellectual form. Commitment to the photographic model is not, as Noriega-Olmos seems to suggest, an essential ingredient of the two-step view. Modrak, for example, devoted substantial sections of her recent book to setting out a non-photographic model of thought and its object within a two-step account. Caston's suggestion (building on an idea of Aquinas) that the forms grasped by the thinker are to be understood as ratios shared with the relevant objects, offers another way to reject the photographic account, consistent with the two-step view of signification. Unfortunately, Noriega-Olmos does not engage with these or other similar modifications of the two-step interpretation in detail.

Noriega-Olmos correctly suggests that Aristotle's discussion in De Anima serves to deepen our understanding of the relation of likeness. However, there has been (and continues to be) a lively debate among those who agree with this approach as to how the relevant texts in De Anima (only some of which Noriega-Olmos cites) as well as others in De Memoria and De Insomniis concerning the content of our thoughts and perceptions are to be understood. Some, like Modrak and Caston, follow the representationalist line just noted. Others, myself included, have suggested that, when we think, our thinking faculties are assimilated to (made like) the objects in question. On this view, likenesses are to be understood as 'likened-nesses' (to use Cherniss' helpful term), the result of a process of causal assimilation to the objects in question.

This view can be developed in several ways. In one, there is an intentional, mind-dependent, object that is the causal product of a mind-independent object via the likening relation. Part of what makes that thought the one it is is that it is caused in this way. On this account, one's thought would be of Castor and not his twin-brother Castor* when it is caused by the former not the latter. Alternatively, in the 'non-representational' account (considered, for example, by Hermann Weidemann), when the thinking faculty is likened or assimilated to a mind-independent object, the direct object of one's thought is the mind-independent object itself. So understood, what thinkers grasp in thinking about Castor (i.e., the content of their thoughts) is Castor, not a mind-dependent representation of Castor. Noriega-Olmos' discussion would have gained from considering these alternative, De Anima based ways of developing the traditional view of signification.

(ii) While some take all thoughts to be likenesses of 'concrete' objects (as Noriega-Olmos suggests), not all two-step interpreters do so. Some construe 'things' more liberally (as Noriega-Olmos himself does) to include, for example, universals, abstract and even fictitious entities such as goat-stags, understood as mind-independent objects. (Perhaps goat-stags are made up of parts of goats and parts of stags). Others interpret the phrase 'what they [the affections] are likenesses of are indeed things' to apply not to all thoughts but only to those which are (for example) the causal product of the likening-process. On the latter view, the things in question will be restricted to those that are the causes of a likening-process. External 'concrete' objects may be one such cause, universals another, states of affairs another.

There may, however, be thoughts that were not likenesses of mind-independent entities: mind-dependent objects we form by combining thoughts of different objects. Thoughts of goat-stags might be of this kind. Although the term 'goat-stag' signifies something, there will be no mind-independent, 'concrete', object signified. So understood, Aristotle allows for a variety of types of signification, depending on the types of thought-content involved. In some cases, what is signified will be a mind-independent object (of which thoughts are causal likenesses); in others -- as in thoughts of goat-stags -- it will not be (since there is no likeness relation). In the former, but not the latter, it is essential that mind-independent (sometimes even 'concrete') objects are (non-accidentally) signified. It is unfortunate that Noriega-Olmos fails to engage with the varied and interesting ways in which its proponents (including those mentioned in the last paragraph) have developed and extended the traditional two-step account of signification.

(2) The only [non-accidental] objects of signification (in Aristotle's account) are the contents of our thoughts: the formal aspects of things as they are instantiated in our minds.

Noriega-Olmos argues in favour of (2) by suggesting that Aristotle held

[P] Thoughts are likenesses of things in virtue of their content sharing a quality with the objects in question,

and, on this basis, concluded that

[Q] Linguistic expressions non-accidentally signify thoughts (and thoughts alone) in virtue of their mind-dependent content having the same formal aspects as the things with which they share a quality.

which entails (2). But, even if Aristotle did accept [P], why think he made the further move to [Q]? According to the traditional view, he accepted [P] while rejecting [Q]. Its proponents point to texts where what is signified appears to be an external real world 'concrete' object, such as that in which what is signified by a name (or name-like expression) is the very thing that is discovered to exist (Posterior Analytics B. 10, 93b32), whose essence we can go on to discover. Aristotle's enquirer is, after all, interested in investigating objects and kinds in the world, not mind-dependent thoughts about such kinds. Similarly, at Posterior Analytics A.1, 71a15f, Aristotle speaks of our terms signifying things in the world. Elsewhere, he takes names such as 'the sun' to signify substances (Metaphysics Z. 15, 1040a32) and suggests that names are symbols of things (which can be carried: Sophisticis Elenchis 165a6ff).

Unfortunately, Noriega-Olmos does not consider these -- or other -- texts used to support the view that, on occasion, names signify external objects. Nor do these passages suggest that linguistic expressions signify objects in the world in the accidental or derivative manner he permits. Most modern scholars who have argued for the two-step account of signification have not done so because it coincides with some 'modern perspective' (p. 1) such as 'the Semiotic Triangle' apparently advanced by C. K. Ogden and I. A. Richards (p. 118). They have thought, as did their medieval predecessors, that there was good evidence in the Analytics and elsewhere for seeing it as an essential part of Aristotle's viewpoint.

Noriega-Olmos advances several exegetical considerations to support interpreting Aristotle as endorsing [Q]. I shall consider four of them.

(i) The fact that Aristotle uses the adjectival term 'first things' (genitive plural) rather than 'first' (adverbial) in the key sentences in De Interpretatione 1 suggests (in his view) that the relevant objects are primary objects in some important philosophical sense. Had Aristotle wished merely to say that they were first in a sequence ending (on occasion) with things in the world, he would (according to Noriega-Olmos) have used the adverbial form. However, even if we retain the adjectival term (with the Oxford text), it could (as Noriega-Olmos himself cedes) refer to the first members of a sequence, with the genitive used in apposition to the original subject of the phrase 'of these things' (and contrasted with the second members of the sequence marked by 'only then'). In Noriega-Olmos' preferred account, however, Aristotle introduces in these few lines the key theoretical idea of objects which are primary in some important philosophical sense ('primordials', as he describes them) without preparation in the preceding lines or elucidation in the immediately following ones. But when Aristotle uses this term to refer to the first items in a science, he indicates this by using clarificatory phrases such 'the unmediated and first' or 'the unmoved first items in demonstration' or by the context. It would be very surprising if he were to introduce 'out of the blue' the idea of what is first in some (unspecified) theoretically important way at the very beginning of De Interpretatione without any further spelling out in the immediate context.

Noriega-Olmos does not point to other texts where 'first' is used in the context of a discussion of signification in a comparable way. Nor is his interpretation immediately plausible: if Aristotle had used the term 'first things' in the way suggested, he would be severely restricting the range of linguistic expressions involved to those used by dialecticians, scientists and relevant experts (p. 128) when thinking about essences or forms, the metaphysical building blocks of Aristotle's theory. But there is no indication of any such limitation in De Interpretatione 1 and 2: the discussion appears to consider all linguistic expressions (at which thought stops: De Int. 16b20f), focusing on names such as 'Kallippos', 'goat-stag', 'horse', 'pirate boat' and 'Philon' (De Interpretatione 2), without confining their use to specifically dialectical or metaphysical contexts.

(ii) Aristotle (according to Noriega-Olmos) needs to accept [Q] to allow for thoughts of non-existents, such as of goat-stags. While several replies to this point have already been noted, it is important to add that when Aristotle turns, later in De Interpretatione, to consider names that are given to two different objects (such as man and horse, to which one might compare: half-goat and half-stag), he suggests that they either signify nothing (18a25) or many things (perhaps the set with these two members). He does not claim that they signify one thing, such as the form or essence of the goat-stag. Indeed, elsewhere he denies that non-existent objects have essences (Posterior Analytics B.7, 92b28-30), which Noriega-Olmos treats as equivalent to forms.

(iii) In Noriega-Olmos' account, the contents of thoughts, of which linguistic expressions are signs, have the same formal aspects as the objects of which they are likenesses: they instantiate the same form as those objects. But why does it follow from this that the relevant linguistic expressions signify nothing beyond the mind-dependent contents of our thoughts? They could, for all that has been so far said, signify the mind independent objects with which they have the same formal aspects (as in one version of the two-step view). Or they could signify the mind-independent forms of the objects of which the thoughts are likenesses. Even if the mind-dependent contents are the same in Form as objects in the world, this by itself in no way shows that what is signified is the Form-as-instantiated-in-thought rather than the (mind independent) Form, which is present in the objects themselves. At this point, there is a major gap in Noriega-Olmos's account, precisely where further argument is needed to show that what is signified is just the formal aspects of the thought itself in our minds. Had Noriega-Olmos engaged seriously with versions of the traditional model other than the photographic model, he would have seen the need for further argumentation at this point.

(iv) Noriega-Olmos suggests that Aristotle is not offering a theory of semantics and communication in De Interpretatione 1 but rather 'a theory of the cognitive content of language' (p. 174). This remark is, of course, a re-statement of his conclusion, not a reason to accept it. Nor does it take into account the apparent evidence for a word-world signification in the Posterior Analytics, Metaphysics and elsewhere. However, even understood as an account of cognitive significance alone, Noriega-Olmos' account is not one that Aristotle himself could easily have accepted. In it, 'man' and 'the form of man' have not merely the same reference (as many interpreters would agree), but the same cognitive significance since both terms are associated with the same formal aspect of man present in our thoughts. But this consequence appears to run contrary to Aristotle's insistence (in the Analytics and elsewhere) that in scientific enquiry we move from grasping that man exists to grasping the essence of man. This transition would not be possible if the cognitive significance of both 'man' and 'the form- or essence- of man' were to be given in exactly the same way in terms of the form (or essence) of man.

Noriega-Olmos is to be commended for seeking to challenge, in an ingenious way, long established, two-step interpretations of Aristotle's account of signification. Even if he has not achieved his ambitious goals, he has succeeded in making a significant contribution to an important topic.


Caston, V., 'The Spirit and the Letter: Aristotle on Perception,' in R. Salles (ed.), Metaphysics, Soul, and Ethics in Ancient Thought: Themes from the Work of Richard Sorabji, 245-320. Oxford Univeristy Press, 2005.

Charles, D., Aristotle on Meaning and Essence, Oxford University Press, 2000.

Modrak D., Aristotle's Theory of Language and Meaning, Cambridge University Press, 2001.

Shields C., 'Intentionality and Isomorphism in Aristotle,' Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, 1995, 11: 307-30.

Weidemann H., 'War Aristoteles ein Repräsentationlist?', in D. Perler (ed.), Ancient and Modern Theories of Intentionality, 97-104, Brill, 2001.