Aristotle's Categories in the Early Roman Empire

Placeholder book cover

Michael J. Griffin, Aristotle's Categories in the Early Roman Empire, Oxford University Press, 2015, 283pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198724735.

Reviewed by George Karamanolis, University of Vienna


Aristotle's short, early work known as the Categories had an enormous impact on philosophers in antiquity. From the 1st century BCE to the 6th century CE it attracted considerable attention not only from Peripatetics, as one would expect, but also, and indeed predominantly, from Platonists as well as Stoics. Indicative of that attention are the seven ancient extant commentaries on that treatise, more than on any other work of Aristotle, all of which were authored by Platonists (Porphyry, Dexippus, Ammonius, Olympiodorus, Philoponus, Simplicius, and Elias), while several other commentaries of Peripatetics and Platonists do not survive (e.g., Alexander's, Porphyry's long commentary, and Iamblichus'). Besides these commentaries written between the late 2nd and the 6th century CE, we possess a number of remarks on the Categories from the period between 1st c. BCE and 2nd c. CE, some of which also stem from commentaries. The authors of these remarks include Peripatetics such as Andronicus and Boethus, Platonists such as Eudorus, Lucius, and Nicostratus, Stoics like Athenodorus and Cornutus, as well as a pythagorizing version of the Categories attributed to Archytas. Michael J. Griffin sets out to reconstruct this early debate about the Categories on which the later commentaries heavily draw.

This early debate is very interesting. One reason is that at that stage the debate about the Categories is more diverse than in the later exegetical tradition, which is much more unified due to the impact of Porphyry's interpretation. For the most part later commentators adopt Porphyry's view that the Categories is primarily a work of semantics (and not of ontology) and operate with many of the distinctions that he makes. In the period between 1st c. BCE and 2nd c. CE, however, more interpretations of the subject matter (skopos) and the overall aim of the Categories are represented. Peripatetics, Platonists, and Stoics construe the Categories differently, while there were differences within the schools too, although these are not always very clear. Griffin maps out this early exegetical tradition combining philological skills, historical caution and philosophical sensitivity, and succeeds in showing that there was a subtle and sophisticated philosophical controversy among the early exegetes of the Categories.

Griffin's book contains seven chapters divided in three parts. After an introduction about the nature of the Categories, the goals, methods, and aims of the book, Griffin embarks on a study of the earliest exegetical treatments of the Categories that stem from two near contemporaries (mid 1st c. BCE), the Peripatetic Andronicus and the Platonist Eudorus (treated in chapters 2 and 3 respectively). Part two focuses on the criticisms of the Categories by the Platonists Lucius and Nicostratus (chapter 4) and by the Stoics Athenodorus and Cornutus (chapter 5). In part three Griffin moves to the Peripatetic response to the critics of the Categories by Boethus of Sidon, which also is a synthesis of earlier Peripatetic interpretations (chapter 6). The final chapter 7 is a short (too short in my view) overview of the interpretations of second century Platonists such as Plutarch and Atticus and contemporary Peripatetics, such as Herminus and Alexander.

Let me now take a closer look at the chapters beginning with the one on Andronicus. Griffin argues that Andronicus placed the Categories at the beginning of his catalogue of Aristotelian works on the grounds that this work deals with logic, which he considered as an instrument for philosophy, and as such should be learned first. More precisely, Griffin argues, Andronicus maintained that the Categories helps to train us in demonstration, for in his view the core of the Categories is a guide to distinguishing between synonymous and homonymous predication, which is crucial for avoiding ambiguity when we set out to define or demonstrate something. For in a syllogism, say Barbara, AB, BC: AC, if B is used homonymously in one premise, the conclusion does not follow from the premises (since we do not deal with B throughout but with B and B1). On this rationale Andronicus associated the Categories with the Analytics and favoured the title "Categories" over the alternative title Before the Topics, which implied that Aristotle's work should be read in connection with the Topics and as an introduction to the science of dialectic. Griffin adduces good textual evidence (from Porphyry, Boethius and Simplicius) illustrating Andronicus' interpretation that the Categories aims to develop our notions of logic and our understanding of predication (i.e. how we classify things under the ten predications outlined in the Categories), which explains why he rejected the authenticity of the so-called post-praedicamenta, the last section of the Categories (chs. 10-15), which is not about the ten predications.

I have one critical remark on this chapter. Griffin tries to connect Andronicus with the interpretation of his younger contemporary and probable student, Boethus, and also with that of Porphyry on the grounds that both Andronicus and Boethus (and perhaps also Herminus) speak of the role of the Categories in activating our notions of logic and that Porphyry credits his argumentation about the subject matter and the title of the Categories to Boethus and Herminus. There is clearly a line of agreement here from Andronicus to Boethus and Porphyry, but the question is how far it extends; they may all have agreed that the Categories is about predications (or significant expressions applied to things), but apparently only Andronicus explicitly and specifically considered that feature crucial for demonstration, which is why he associated the Categories closely with the Analytics, while Boethus tied the Categories to the De Interpretatione, as we learn in chapter 6.

Chapter 3 focuses on the Pythagoreans Eudorus and Pseudo-Archytas, who must be Andronicus' contemporaries. Noticeably, the Pythagoreans are interested in the Categories from a point of view similar to that of Andronicus, namely as a treatise that helps us understand the particulars through universal classes, the ten predications. Eudorus resembles Andronicus further in dividing the categories, the ten predications, into absolute and relative. But Eudorus also differs significantly from Andronicus. For Andronicus the distinction between per se and per accidens predication tallies with the distinction between substance and non-substance categories, whereas for Eudorus it does not, for, he suggests, the latter (with the exception of relation) can also be understood as predicable per se. This does not mean that Eudorus differs from Andronicus on the importance of the distinction between per se and per accidens predication but that they differ on its significance. Eudorus is not only correcting Andronicus, but, as Griffin well shows (p. 85-86), he also criticizes Aristotle on the grounds that not only substance but also non-substance categories (e.g. quality) should be treated as absolute (Simplicius, In Cat. 174.14-26).

This is not as innocent as it seems. Apparently Eudorus' point was that Aristotle's categories do not fully apply to the intelligible world but only to the sensible realm, a point that is probably corroborated by Plutarch's report in De animae procreatione in Timaeo 1023D-1024A (see p. 92-94). It is no accident that Eudorus differs from Andronicus also on the order of the categories, arguing that they should be re-organized on the basis of the proximity of the non-substance categories to substance. This view of Eudorus is accounted for by the fact that he understood substance causally, i.e. he considered substance as the cause of all non-substantial categories, which means that he understood the Categories as concerned with beings and thus with ontology, not with logic, and he criticized Aristotle from this ontological point of view, as is the case later with Lucius, Nicostratus and Plotinus. Griffin tends to emphasize Eudorus' positive attitude towards the Categories, suggesting that Eudorus might have represented Aristotle as a Pythagorean, as happens with Pseudo-Archytas and later Platonists. I find this implausible because Pythagoreans were averse to criticizing anything Pythagorean, while Eudorus was quite critical of Aristotle's Categories. Griffin is surely right (p. 99) that both Eudorus and Pseudo-Archytas wanted to integrate the theory of categories into their own philosophy, but it seems that the former did that while suggesting a number of modifications whereas the latter did not.

Part two, "Early Criticisms: Platonists and Stoics", reviews the criticisms of the Categories from the Platonists Lucius and Nicostratus (ch. 4) and the Stoics Athenodorus and Cornutus (ch. 5). The title of this part is slightly misleading because, as we have seen, Eudorus was also critical. Actually Lucius and Nicostratus may well have appropriated and developed the criticisms of Eudorus, as Griffin suggests (p. 94, 96). Griffin sets out to distinguish the criticisms of these two Platonists often mentioned jointly (p. 127-8) and he is doing a considerable amount of philological work with respect to our main source of these criticisms, Simplicius. There is one point I find questionable in his procedure. Simplicius always uses the locution "hoi peri Loukion" when he refers to Lucius' criticisms, while he refers to Nicostratus' criticisms either with the locution "ho Nikostratos" or "hoi peri Nikostraton". Now while Nicostratus is an identifiable figure,[1] Lucius is not, and Griffin suggests that in the case of Lucius we are possibly dealing not with an individual but with a Platonist or Pythagorean school of thought (p. 108, 212) or a certain "group of doctrines" (p. 110), and he subsequently speaks of "the Lucians". This is the result of understanding the locution "hoi peri X" as "X's associates" or "X's school". But the phrase can also mean "the person X" and in imperial times it was used with that meaning (see LSJ sense C2).

Lucius and Nicostratus follow a common strategy with regard to the Categories, which is raising difficulties about aspects of it while also criticizing Aristotle's theory for not applying to intelligible reality, a point adopted by Plotinus but rebutted by Boethus and Porphyry (Simplicius, In Cat. 73.15-28). This is not the only case of a critical point of Lucius and Nicostratus that Boethus and Porphyry later target, as is illustrated in the rest of the chapter and also in chapter 6. In the end, however, it is not entirely clear how much different Lucius and Nicostratus were in their criticism of the Categories. The fact that Nicostratus is mentioned as being additionally concerned with the structure of the Categories does not change the fact that his line of critique is identical with Lucius'.

The next chapter is one of the best in the book. It deals with a relatively neglected part of the early discussion of the Categories, the critique by the Stoics Athenodorus and Cornutus. While the former cannot be dated with precision (mid 1st c. BCE?), the latter is known as the tutor of the poet Persius and as an associate with the emperor Nero. Once again the chapter sets out to distinguish the criticisms of Athenodorus and Cornutus, which for the most part are mentioned jointly in our sources.

What was the point of the Stoic critique? The main Stoic criticism stems from the belief that the Categories is a work of linguistics (or of the grammatical part of logic) and that Aristotle failed in that by leaving out many parts of speech such as articles, conjunctions, propositions as well as figurative or modal expressions. Griffin reconstructs the Stoic criticisms from the replies of Porphyry and Dexippus, who argue that the Categories deal with words of the first imposition, i.e. words signifying things in the world, not words of the second imposition such as "and" or "verb". But this was a Stoic distinction and presumably the Stoics would remain critical after a reply such as that of Porphyry. As Griffin shows, Cornutus criticized Aristotle's Categories for internal incoherence caused by mixing different philosophical disciplines such as logic, ethics and physics; by doing that Cornutus challenged Athenodorus' main line of criticism. This time Griffin succeeds in distinguishing the criticisms of the two Stoics. However, again their agreement is more important than their differences; their common source of criticisms, Griffin argues (following J. Barnes[2]), is the propositional nature of Stoic logic, while Aristotle's is term logic (p. 173). This plausibly explains both why Athenodorus understood the Categories as a work of linguistics and not of semantics, given that the Categories speaks of terms and not of propositions, and why Cornutus criticizes the treatise for incoherence, given the variety of the discussed terms in it. But if this is the case, it is unlikely that Athenodorus dealt with the Categories before Andronicus, as Griffin suggests (p. 172). It makes more sense that the Stoic Athenodorus reacted to a revival of Peripatetic logic, for which Andronicus was responsible.

Part three consists of a chapter on Boethus (ch. 6) and of a very short one (ch. 7) on second century developments. In chapter 6 Griffin shows three things. First, that Boethus considered the Categories not just a work of semantics and logic but in part also a work of ontology, as he maintained that it deals with words that signify sensible beings. Second, Boethus went beyond Andronicus in assigning to concepts a mediating role between words and sensible beings. Third, Boethus responded to the challenges and criticisms advanced by Lucius and Athenodorus. Although Boethus maintained that the Categories deals only with sensible beings, he did discuss intelligible beings such as Form and was furthermore concerned with the relation between the accounts of substance in the Categories and the Metaphysics. This is a very interesting part of Boethus' thought that Griffin only touches upon. The chapter ends by pointing out that Boethus' concern with the varying accounts of substance in Aristotle's two works is a challenging one. But the reader would like to see the challenge spelled out, given the evidence that Boethus considered sensible individuals as substances and Form as a non-substantial accident, a view for which he was criticized by Porphyry (Simplicius, In Cat. 78.17-24) who on the whole sided with Boethus' interpretation of the Categories.

Chapter 7 is too short to do justice to the complexity of the discussion on the Categories in the 2nd century, which includes the Platonist Atticus and the Peripatetics Aspasius, Herminus, and Alexander of Aphrodisias. There is, moreover, another 2nd century treatment of the Categories not even mentioned, the account of Clement of Alexandria, a 2nd century Christian, the first Christian to discuss the Categories (Stromata VIII.23-24). This is particularly interesting because Clement resembles Boethus in understanding the categories both as elements of sensible beings and as elements of thought that correspond to concepts. Clement claimed that the categories are conceptual tools by means of which we classify things in the world and can then assess whether a thing or concept x belongs to a category F (e.g. substance or quality). Clement resembles Boethus further in being inspired by the first chapter of De interpretatione, suggesting that there is an analogy between significant expressions and things on the one hand and concepts and things on the other. Clement understood the Categories as a work of logic that can help in demonstration (this was important to him in building an anti-skeptical argument in Stromata VIII) but also as a work of ontology. It is not at all clear whether Clement draws on Boethus or on both Andronicus and Boethus, but it would be worthwhile to explore the possibilities here.

The book ends with a brief summary of its findings and three useful appendices, one of persons and sources, another of Andronicus' works and sources, and an outline of Aristotle's Categories. It is rounded off by a bibliography, a general index and an index of passages. Apparently the first appendix was originally placed at the beginning of the doctoral thesis from which the book derives, since on one occasion we are referred to "the following chapters" (p. 217 concerning Ammonius). The book is highly readable despite the amount of philological and historical detail it contains and is well proof-read (I noticed only the following misprints: p. 62 "Κατγορίαι" instead of "Κατηγορίαι", p. 170 πρὀς instead of πρὸς, p. 207, "Archtyas" instead of "Archytas"). Griffin must be congratulated for exploring the early exegetical tradition of the Categories in such detail and for confirming that exegetical debates in later ancient philosophy are not scholastic developments but philosophically and historically significant. His book will remain a standard work of reference in the field of the exegetical tradition of the Categories.


1] See the seminal paper of Karl Praechter, "Nikostratos der Platoniker", Hermes 57 (1922), 481-517.

[2] See Jonathan Barnes, "Aristotle and Stoic Logic", in Katerina Ierodiakonou (ed.), Topics in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford 1999, 23-53.