Aristotle's Generation of Animals: A Critical Guide

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Andrea Falcon and David Lefebvre (eds.), Aristotle's Generation of Animals: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 304pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107132931.

Reviewed by Sylvia Berryman, University of British Columbia


A series of critical essays by major scholars in the field, rather than a blow-by-blow analysis of a text, Andrea Falcon and David Lefebvre's recent collection of works on Aristotle's embryological treatise fills a significant gap in the recent literature on Aristotle's biology. The collection was originally co-edited by Allan Gotthelf, but his death in 2013 prevented him from completing the task. Conferences organized by Gotthelf, Lefebvre and Devin Henry contributed to the vetting of the contributions to this volume, which aims to present a comprehensive and up-to-date view on the major philosophical issues and controversies surrounding the work. The persisting prejudice in academic publishing that collections originating with conferences are mere 'proceedings' is simply inapplicable in this field, where the need to focus systematic scholarly attention on neglected corners of the corpus has been met through the practice of convening experts to work on underserved areas. This volume is one such result.

That said, the volume does not address a single issue so much as a series of problems in understanding Aristotle's views. The collection begins with a programmatic piece by the two original editors, proclaiming the unity of Aristotle's work. In 1934, Joseph Needham's History of Embryology complained of the 'haphazard' organization of Aristotle's work on animal reproduction, a view that has since been dispelled. Aristotle's treatise is now understood as a piece of Aristotle's larger philosophical project, which includes understanding how things with natures come to be and grow according to their internal principles. Gotthelf and Falcon argue that the treatise focuses on the efficient cause of generation, centering on the guiding observation that sexual generation follows the union of male and female of the same species. Pierre Pellegrin's contribution situates the notion of reproduction within the nutrutive faculty, for Aristotle, explaining why a treatise on reproduction includes reference to the faculty governing growth. Aristotle's hierarchical approach to natural kinds leads to his focus on the case of the most 'perfect' kinds, treating others -- including the difficult case of so-called 'spontaneous generation' of some simple species -- as derivative forms. Cristina Cerami follows Gad Freudenthal in linking the scala naturae to the presence of vital heat, a feature present in various species to different degrees.

As Lefebvre argues, Aristotle hypothesizes that the 'final cause' or purpose of sexual generation lies in its ability to create more options for diverse functions. Within what Jocelyn Groisard calls his 'fixist' biology, it is typically thought that species forms are taken to be eternal, a commitment that seems to be challenged by the recognition of hybrid species. Mariska Leunissen significantly focuses on the idea that the treatise has a method, by looking at Aristotle's critique of his predecessors: without a notion of what is prior by nature, there is no way to look for an appropriate order of development in embryos. Drawing on the causal role various parts play in the finished organism, he attempts to account for the developmental order found in nature. Henry argues against the notion that we can discern any recognition of epigenetics in Aristotle, however, denying that the developing form of the organism has a capacity for responding 'intelligently' to its environment. As is often the case, contemporary developments inspire new readings of Aristotle's intent; in this case, requiring a careful distinction between two different ways that the Aristotelian notion of epigenesis might be understood.

Some essays focus on issues that extend beyond the treatise itself. Robert Bolton's study of the principles at work draws heavily on Aristotle's more systematic work on scientific method, Posterior Analytics. Bolton addresses the debates around the role of nominal definition, arguing that Aristotle did not intend to endorse a highly implausible view of the nature of scientific inquiry, which had been ascribed to him since W.D. Ross. More surprisingly, Marwan Rashed's study of the 'froth' theory central to the account of semen's formal role diverges into a geometrical problem about the conception of the sphere and circle as mathematical versus material objects. This ambitious and fascinating exploration may ultimately say more about the relationship between Platonic and Aristotelian mathematics than it does about seminal fluid. The relationship between Parts of Animals and the present treatise surfaces several times, but for the most part, the issues involved are unique to the problems of sexual generation.

Jessica Gelber makes a distinctive contribution on the status of the female, rejecting both the 'standard view' that they are defective males and Henry's suggestion that nature is neutral with regard to sex, arguing convincingly that the purpose of females cannot be left out of the theory. Here, the standard scholarly position of attempting to find a defensible reading of a historical figure's views does not seem strained, but instead suggests a moderate reading of Aristotle's views on the biological role of females. Gregory Salmieri re-examines the evidence that the form transmitted by the male parent is a particular form containing features specific to the parent, and not merely a generic form. This controversy concerns a central issue in the interpretation of Aristotelian form. Sophia Connell argues that Aristotle's treatment of birth defects shows evidence of systematicity, although according to his doctrine accidents per se are not subjects of scientific explanation. James Lennox concludes the volume with an examination of the evidence that Aristotle is urging his readers to refer to actual dissected specimens as well as diagrams.

This is undeniably a work for scholars, although the essays are accessible and keep textual discussion to a minimum. A general index and index of passages assist in navigating the volume, which will surely become a standard reference work in the field.