Aristotle's Physics: A Critical Guide

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Mariska Leunissen (ed.), Aristotle's Physics: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 297pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107031463.

Reviewed by Robert Mayhew, Seton Hall University


This collection offers, as the series-description of the Cambridge Critical Guides promises, cutting-edge research on the Physics, one of Aristotle's most fundamental and influential works. As far as I know, this is the first collection of essays devoted to the Physics to appear since the one edited by Lindsay Judson 25 years ago.[1] In the space available I cannot begin to do justice to, but can merely describe, the volume's fourteen chapters, which are of a uniformly high quality.

In the first chapter, "How to study natural bodies: Aristotle's μέθοδος," James G. Lennox argues that although the Posterior Analytics provides the general framework for scientific inquiry in the Physics -- the goals of which are "knowledge of what natural beings are" and "why natural beings have the necessary but non-essential attributes they do" (10) -- there are domain-specific norms and goals of the Physics. These are connected to the fact that the objects of this specific inquiry, natural substances, have inherent sources of change and rest, and have both material and formal natures (in contrast to the objects of mathematics, for instance) -- "there being a teleological dependence of their material nature on their formal nature" (25).

The next two chapters -- Sean Kelsey's "Aristotle on interpreting nature" and Stasinos Stavrianeas's "Nature as a principle of change" -- discuss in different ways Aristotle's definition of 'nature' in Phys. II 1 (or rather, his statement of what it is for something to be natural or to exist by nature): "each of them has within itself a principle of change and rest".[2] Kelsey provides a thorough investigation of how this definition is used in the rest of Phys. II: Although it might seem not to be used at all (explicit references to it are rare), it in fact "serves as both source and signal of an important theme that sets a tacit agenda for the book as a whole" (31), namely, the at first glance puzzling idea that form is a principle of motion. Where Kelsey discusses the role of this definition, Stavrianeas focuses on its meaning. He argues that Aristotle left it intentionally vague or general, so that it could be fleshed out differently in different contexts.

In "Aristotle on chance as an accidental cause," James Allen offers a new interpretation of Aristotle's discussion of chance (and its two species, luck and the automatic) in Phys. II 4-6. His interpretation, in brief, is that "Aristotle regards chance occurrences as something like byproducts of final causation, which are only intelligible as exceptions to the teleological rule" (69). In making his case, Allen draws on EN V 8, and connects his account to the discussion of teleology and material necessity in Phys. II 8. There is an interesting and useful appendix on an etymological argument in Phys. II 6, which involves the resemblance or relationship between αὐτόματον and αὐτό μάτην (μάτην = 'in vain'). Incidentally, if one reads Allen's essay alongside Phys. II 4-6 and two other excellent discussions of these chapters (by Lennox and Judson),[3] which offer rather different interpretations, one gets a pretty good sense of how difficult it can be to interpret the Physics and pin down precisely what it is Aristotle is claiming or arguing.

The next three chapters discuss Aristotle's conception of teleology, as presented in Phys. II 8 (though of course relevant texts from elsewhere in the Physics and the rest of the corpus are discussed as well). In "Man from man but not bed from bed: Nature, art and chance in Physics II," Margaret Scharle discusses the rainfall example in Phys. II 8, which is the crux of a scholarly dispute about the scope of final causality in Aristotle. The relevant passage opens: "There is the difficulty: what prevents nature from acting neither for something nor because it is better, but as Zeus rains -- not in order that the corn may grow, but of necessity"[4] (198b16-19). Some scholars hold that teleological explanation is (in the sublunary world) limited to human action and to the nature of living organisms, others that it extends to inanimate processes like rainfall. The former take the rainfall example to be something Aristotle agrees with (i.e. that inanimate processes, such as rain falling, are due to material necessity alone), the latter as an example of a position he rejects along with the materialist account of living things. Scharle's chapter may be the best defense to date of the view that according to Aristotle, (winter) rainfall is a teleological process.[5] (I don't think this view is, in the end, correct -- I find for instance Malcolm Wilson's recent account more compelling[6] -- but there's no reason to take my word for it.) Charlotte Witt's "In defense of the craft analogy: Artifacts and natural teleology" discusses the role of craft analogy in the argument of Phys. II (and especially II 8), and -- unlike most other scholars writing on this topic -- she stresses the similarities between artifacts and natural beings, which strengthens the analogy. In particular, she argues that artifacts are ontologically similar to natural beings in having "inherent ends and proper functions" (119). In the next chapter, Robert Bolton offers an account of "The origins of Aristotle's natural teleology in Physics II." He focuses on the differences between Aristotle and his predecessors (especially Empedocles and Plato) on these issues, and the account of Aristotle's conception of natural teleology that emerges from this has two crucial components:

(1) Final causality is not reducible to, or analyzable or explicable in terms of, any other kind of causality, such as efficient causality; and (2) in the natural world, that things have the sort of fitness they clearly now do is typically something that holds by nature, not by chance (142-43).

The remaining chapters deal, in various ways, with Aristotle's conception of kinêsis (usually rendered 'change' or 'motion'). Devin Henry, in "Substantial generation in Physics I.5-7," challenges the orthodox view that, according to these chapters of the Physics (and in particular I 7), substantial change requires a pre-existing subject that survives that change. He argues that whereas "Physics I.7 is silent on the question" (144), evidence from outside the Physics -- and especially passages in On Generation and Corruption -- suggest that this is not a view that Aristotle endorsed. In "A dynamic ontology: On how Aristotle arrived at the conclusion that eternal change accomplishes ousia," Diana Quarantotto investigates the relationship between change and ousia (which she renders 'being'). She focuses on GC II 10, Phys. I-III (especially III 1-3), and Phys. VIII, and discusses the development of Aristotle's account of this relationship in terms of the Aristotelian distinction[7] between what is more familiar to us (Phys. I-III) and what is less familiar to us but closer by nature (Phys. VIII). In "Aristotle's processes," David Charles provides a careful analysis of Aristotle's account of kinêseis in the Physics (and especially in III 1-3). Special attention is given to Aristotle's definition of kinêsis as "the actuality of that which is potentially . . . as such"[8] (Phys. III 1.201a11-12). Charles engages with the two main lines of interpretation of this definition and, drawing on Metaphysics Θ (on actuality and potentiality), offers an alternative interpretation of his own. He concludes that Aristotle's kinêseis "are processes, not events," and that a "proper appreciation of this point has important implications for our understanding of his accounts of action, time, and causation" (205). In "Physics V-VI versus VIII: Unity of change and disunity in the Physics," a brief but superb essay, Jacob Rosen investigates the relationship (and tension) between the Phys. V-VI account of changes and continua, and the account of eternal motion in Phys. VIII 8. He concludes (among other things) that, pace W.D. Ross, Phys. V-VI and VIII don't constitute a "continuous treatise on movement" (206).[9]

Phys. VII 3 is devoted to alteration (ἀλλοίωσις), which, Aristotle says, concerns changes of perceptual qualities. He goes on, somewhat unexpectedly, to claim that states of the soul or body are not alterations, and further, that virtue therefore (which is a state of the soul) is not an alteration but a kind of perfection. In "Perfection and the physiology of habituation according to Physics VII.3," Mariska Leunissen discusses how we are to understand habituation -- which is crucial to Aristotle's conception of moral development -- in light of Phys. VII 3, and further, what Phys. VII 3 can contribute to our understanding of Aristotle's moral theory, and particularly his conception of the physiological basis of habituation. She argues that moral development involves the alteration of certain capacities of the perceptive part of the soul (the part concerning perception and imagination, pleasure and pain, and appetites and desires), but that nevertheless the coming to be of a virtue "is not itself . . . an alteration, but the perfection that arises when all the constitutive elements of the perceptive part of the soul are in the best condition and are proportionately organized regarding each other" (244). This is a fine piece of scholarship, which makes clear important connections between Aristotle's Physics and his ethical works.

Two chapters are devoted to Phys. VIII, on eternal motion and the unmoved mover. Ursula Coope's "Self-motion as other-motion in Aristotle's Physics," is an interpretation of Phys. VIII 5 and Aristotle's account therein of the role of self-motion in his argument for the existence of an unmoved mover. Along the way, interesting and important connections are made to Metaph. Λ and Plato's Laws X. In "The argument of Physics VIII," Andrea Falcon provides a succinct but compelling account of the last book of the Physics. He traces -- in the language of APo. II -- what he calls the ei esti ('whether it is') stage through to the ti esti ('what it is') stage of the investigation into the eternity of motion. Falcon argues that "there is a single plan running from the beginning to the end of Physics VIII" (267), and that the focus throughout is on eternal motion. The unmoved mover, he claims, is a secondary object of study. By distinguishing this from the primary object of study, Falcon has an answer for those who think that Phys. VIII goes beyond the boundaries of natural philosophy into metaphysics or first philosophy, or "builds a bridge between these two sciences" (265). Falcon makes a strong case for this reading of Phys. VIII, though one might well wonder whether Aristotle would have been all that concerned about crossing the boundary (all the while aware that there is one) into first philosophy when discussing -- even in the Physics -- eternal motion and the unmoved mover. One minor complaint in what is otherwise one of my favorite chapters: there is no engagement with, or even mention of, any of the secondary literature on Physics VIII. (I thought at the very least some mention of Daniel Graham's commentary was in order, if only as a foil.[10])

My only complaints about the volume as a whole concern two omissions, one minor and one major. First, there is no index locorum, which would have been a big help to scholars working on the Physics. (Excluding an index locorum, however, may have been not the decision of the editor but the policy of the Cambridge Critical Guides series.) Second, there are no essays devoted to the following fascinating and important 'treatises' in Physics III-IV: on the infinite (III 4-8), place (IV 1-5), void (IV 6-9), and time (IV 10-14). Place and time have recently both been the subject of a monograph (or three);[11] but void and the infinite have not received that kind of attention[12] and arguably should have received some here. (Of course, as anyone who has edited an academic collection knows, the best laid plans of editors often go awry -- owing to potential contributors ignoring deadlines and withdrawing too late to be replaced -- so one should not assume this was an error in the editor's original conception of the volume.) I noted a few typographical errors: e.g. a superfluous 'on' in the last line of p. 1; the common misspelling 'Nichomachean' on p. 77; in ch. 9, both NE and EN are used as abbreviations for the Nicomachean Ethics (cf. pp. 163 n. 3 and 174 n. 27); more than once 'Metaphysics Λ' appears as 'Metaphysics L' (see e.g. pp. 9 and 245).

Such complaints aside, this excellent collection is of great value to scholars of Aristotle's methodology and natural philosophy. For as the editor explains in her Introduction, it provides (1) a reassessment of the key concepts of Aristotle's natural philosophy (e.g. nature, chance, teleology, kinêsis), (2) a reconstruction of his methods for studying nature (among other things, illuminating the relationship between the Physics and the Posterior Analytics), and (3) a clearer indication of the (not always obvious) boundaries between natural philosophy and other areas, especially metaphysics.

[1]Lindsay Judson, Aristotle's Physics: A Collection of Essays (Oxford 1991). My brief review of this book appeared in Review of Metaphysics 47 (1993).

[2]This is Stavrianeas's translation (47). Kelsey's excellent chapter would have begun more effectively had he at the outset provided the definition and not simply referred to it.

[3]James G. Lennox, "Aristotle on chance," Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 66 (1984): 52-60, and Lindsay Judson, "Chance and 'Always or For the Most Part'," in Lindsay Judson ed., Aristotle's Physics: A Collection of Essays (Oxford 1991): 73-99.

[4]This is the translation in Jonathan Barnes, Revised Oxford Translation: The Complete Works of Aristotle (Princeton 1984), as modified by Scharle (89).

[5]For examples of other works defending (broadly speaking) the view defended by Scharle, see David Furley, "The Rainfall Example in Physics ii 8," in Allan Gotthelf ed., Aristotle on Nature and Living Things (Pittsburgh 1986): 177-82, and David Sedley, "Is Aristotle's Teleology Anthropocentric?" Phronesis 36 (1991): 179-96.

[6]Malcolm Wilson, Structure and Method in Aristotle's Meteorologica: A More Disorderly Nature (Cambridge 2013), ch. 5. Scharle does not mention this work, though perhaps it appeared too late for her to engage with it.

[7]See e.g. Phys. I 1 and PA I 5.644b22-645a36.

[8]Charles's translation, which includes the ellipsis (187).

[9]Rosen is quoting W.D. Ross, Aristotle's Physics: A Revised Text with Introduction and Commentary (Oxford 1936): 3.

[10]Daniel Graham, Aristotle: Physics Book VIII (Oxford 1999). With Falcon's reference to building bridges in mind, note this comment from Graham's introduction: "Ultimately Physics VIII serves as a bridge between physics, cosmology, metaphysics, and theology" (xvi).

[11]Benjamin Morison, On Location: Aristotle's Concept of Place (Oxford 2002); Elena Cavagnaro, Aristotele e il Tempo (Bologna 2012); Ursula Coope, Time for Aristotle (Oxford 2005); and, Tony Roark, Aristotle on Time: A Study of the Physics (Cambridge 2011).

[12]Note however John M. Cooper, "Aristotelian Infinites," forthcoming in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 51 (2016); its focus is Phys. III 6.