Aristotle's Politics: A Critical Guide

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Thornton Lockwood and Thanassis Samaras (eds.), Aristotle's Politics: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 259pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107052703.

Reviewed by Zena Hitz, St. John's College, Annapolis


Aristotle's Politics holds up the highest ideals of human flourishing and excellence, while fearlessly diving into the nitty-gritty of everyday political circumstances, where neither flourishing nor excellence may seem possible. As such it is rare and invaluable even among the classics of political philosophy. While Aristotle's ethical treatises have inspired massive profusions of fine philosophical work, philosophers have shown comparatively little interest in the Politics. This is surprising, considering that Aristotle opens the Nicomachean Ethics by defining knowledge of the human good as politikê (political knowledge) and given that he closes the work by exhorting us to bring virtue and happiness to life in cities, after studying politics and constitutions. The NE addresses the student of politics and the politician throughout, and virtue and happiness loom large in the Politics. We ought to suspect from all this that the two books are mutually illuminating; and that without further attention to the Politics our philosophically informed understanding of Aristotle's practical thinking may be significantly incomplete.

Students and scholars of Aristotle's practical thought do face significant obstacles to an understanding of his ethics as integrated with politics and vice versa. First of all, there is the text of the Politics: without a clear structure, it seems to ramble from topic to topic. (Scholars have tried to rearrange its structure, but the rearrangements are not a significant improvement, and have, I think, fallen out of fashion.) Aristotle's approach to politics seems first historical, then empirical; here to argue from general normative principles, there not to argue at all. Aristotle's treatment of key questions such as the value of democracy or the rule of law seems dialectical and aporetic. The prose style is considerably drier than that of the NE. The text breaks off in book 8, apparently incomplete. Readers of the NE fired up by questions of virtue and happiness will be puzzled by long discussions of pragmatic political considerations that seem to have nothing to do with either.

The literature on the Politics reflects the apparent lack of structure and focus of the text. One can find voluminous literature on particular topics, such as slavery, rights, or the nature of citizenship, but one will be hard pressed to find a way into the text that begins from the questions of virtue and happiness familiar from the NE and that treats the book as a whole from a perspective familiar to philosophers. Richard Kraut's Aristotle: Political Philosophy (2002) is one exception, as is C.D.C. Reeve's introduction to his translation of the Politics (1998). Still, the flood of philosophical literature integrating Aristotle's ethics and politics that they should inspire has yet to appear.

The present book appears not long after the Cambridge Companion to Aristotle's Politics (2013), and both provide valuable contributions to the existing literature. Both books together and separately have the virtues of a broad representation of scholars, both established and newer, and a variety of approaches to the text from philosophy, classics, and political theory. As the editors of the Critical Guide put it, this volume provides a snapshot of the current state of scholarship. Unfortunately, thanks to its diversity in approach and its broad coverage of the Politics, the reader can lose sight of the unity of the collection and how the various questions relate to one another. That said, the editors have brought together essays that are both separately illuminating and often interconnected with one another.

Here I will carve off for discussion those essays that bear on questions about the political manifestations of virtue and happiness. Comments on other topics will be mostly brief.

The centrality of ethics to the Politics is a matter of controversy since the text presents a great deal of what looks like counter-evidence to it. Aristotle describes his ideal city, 'the city of our prayers' in Politics 7 and 8, based on a definition of human happiness as residing in leisure rather than in war and conquest. He suggests that only in such a city will full human excellence be found, and describes the various physical and social conditions that make this excellence and its exercise possible. However, in discussions of other types of regimes, Aristotle often seems to treat political stability as something independently and even primarily valuable. Interpreters have been divided as to how to understand this. Eckart Schütrumpf in "Little to do with justice: Aristotle on distributing political power" presents a powerful challenge to scholars wishing to interpret Aristotle's concern for stability in ethical or eudaimonistic terms. In a detailed analysis of Politics III.6-8, he argues that Aristotle clearly thinks that a regime where the virtuous few rule is just, but unstable, and so ought to compromise its justice by including social classes inferior in virtue. Schütrumpf has raised an important challenge to virtue-centric readers of the Politics like myself. Why would it be beneficial to give power to people with a lower degree of virtue if virtue is the sole standard by which we judge the regime? Or, to put it another way, why or how would excluding large numbers from rule cause problems for the virtue of a regime, as Aristotle sees it?

Pierre Destrée addresses the question of stability from the opposite perspective in "Aristotle on improving imperfect cities." Destrée presents a general argument that when Aristotle discusses the improvement of regimes in Politics 5, he is not concerned with stability as such but with virtue and happiness, and that he holds up the 'city of our prayers' of books 7 and 8 as a model for would-be improvers to imitate. One difficult case for the virtue-centric reader of the Politics is Aristotle's apparently Machiavellian claim that the tyrant can preserve his regime by typical tyrannical means: "that the ruled not trust one another; that they be powerless; that they think small." (1314a25-29; Reeve trans.). Destrée points out that Aristotle seems to reject these recommendations and to endorse a second path: pretending to be a moderate, kingly, person while playing the demagogue with the people (Pol. 1315a41-b4). Aristotle is careful to describe such an improved tyrant as at least "half good" and to say that he rules "better people" (1315b4-10). Thus tyrannies are preserved and made more stable by improvements with respect to character and virtue.

Arlene W. Saxonhouse's "Aristotle on the corruption of regimes: resentment and justice" also deals with the question of stability by drawing attention to the more pessimistic aspects of Aristotle's political thinking. Saxonhouse raises the prospect that in an Aristotelian polis, resentment and envy may never be put to rest. Because of the ubiquity of what she calls 'the prick of exclusion', every political organization is unstable. Her question is captivating, but her case struck me as incomplete without more detailed attention to the prospects for stability and justice. Why are Aristotle's numerous recommendations for improving cities not enough? (I was struck by one of Saxonhouse's proof texts: "All regimes dissolve . . . " (1307b19) only to discover that she left out a condition that changes the meaning of the sentence ". . . when there is a constitution of the opposite type nearby and powerful.")

In all three of these essays I found the interpretations of individual sections of the book instructive, but I was left wondering how the authors would have addressed evidence found elsewhere in the book. Destrée and Schütrumpf come to opposite conclusions, but they are also examining different chapters. Part of the enormous difficulty of the Politics is that Aristotle returns to the same questions many times in different parts of the work. One can analyze a few chapters in the De Anima and feel confident one has addressed Aristotle's view on an issue. But a full treatment of Aristotle on questions of civic virtue or the value of stability or the fragility of political arrangements requires synthesizing passages across a variety of contexts, without losing nuance -- and that is easier said than done.

That makes Ryan Balot's accomplishment in "The 'mixed regime' in Aristotle's Politics" particularly admirable, as it is a sure-footed, wide-ranging, and subtle treatment of a central topic in Aristotle's political thought. Balot contrasts Aristotle's mixed regime or 'polity' with the 'city of our prayers' as a more practicable ideal, although the two regimes resemble each other in important ways. This helps to explain how the city of our prayers functions as the standard of human flourishing by which other political arrangements are judged, and illustrates the unity of Aristotle's political theory. The advantage of the polity over democracy or oligarchy is military virtue, the rule of reason, and civic friendship. But, as Balot points out, the reliance on military virtue may make polity vulnerable to Aristotle's criticisms of the Spartan regime: that since war is for the sake of peace, the exercise of the war-like virtues yields only an incomplete and unstable version of human flourishing. Balot concludes by pointing out that it is a distinctive feature of Aristotle's mixed regime, as opposed to Roman and later versions, that it does not involve managed conflict. Agreement (homonoia) about who should rule and the civic friendship that makes possible are central to a good political order for Aristotle.

Three essays concern the great controversy as to whether and how Aristotle supported democracy. Thanassis Samaras in "Aristotle and the question of citizenship" argues forcefully that the mixed regime or polity as Aristotle endorses it involves the exclusion of the lowest classes, the banausoi or manual workers and so is consistent with his condemnation of democracy elsewhere. At the other end of the spectrum, Josiah Ober's "Nature, history and Aristotle's best regime" argues that the 'city of our prayers' in books 7-8 is (a) a mixed regime or polity and (b) includes all possible citizens as citizens, and so is roughly speaking democratic. Ober's essay also includes a valuable account of Aristotle's views on the historical evolution of the polis through various types, and he makes a fascinating argument that the city of our prayers is the end-point of that evolution. Lastly, Chris Bobonich closely analyzes the famous chapter (Pol 3.11) where Aristotle seems to attribute wisdom to the deliberations of a crowd ("Aristotle, political decision making, and the many.") Bobonich's essay is aporetic, but raises hard-headed questions and difficulties that are a valuable challenge for both existing interpretations and for future interpreters.

Authoritative accounts of linguistic and historical background are a useful addition to a volume of this kind. The word politeia, translated in Aristotle by 'constitution', 'regime' and 'polity' is a complex and crucially important word. Unfortunately, J. J. Mulhern's treatment of its history is flawed, and students and scholars ought rely on it only with caution ("Politeia in Greek literature, inscriptions, and in Aristotle's Politics: reflections on translation and interpretation"). Mulhern's main point is salutary and valuable: politeia meant far more in Greek than an arrangement of political offices, and readers ought not be misled by the common translation 'constitution'. However, his more detailed historical claims are false. Mulhern treats the use of politeia in Herodotus IX.34.3, where it means 'citizenship', as the first instance of the word and thus as reflecting its primary meaning. He neglects the Politeia of the Athenians by pseudo-Xenophon ("The Old Oligarch"), a text roughly contemporary with Herodotus and possibly pre-dating it.[1] Here politeia has its more familiar meaning as the ways, customs and culture of a given community in a given place, including its political structure and laws. The fact that politeia sometimes means 'citizenship' is noteworthy and interesting, but Mulhern presents no clear evidence that this meaning is primary.

Part of Mulhern's historical story involves the Athenian Stranger's claim in Plato's Laws that cities ruled for the sake of the rulers are not true politeiai (712d9-713a2, 715a5-d5; at 832b10-c1 the Stranger says they ought be rather called 'conflict-tutions', stasioteiai). Mulhern claims that the passages show that the word politeia had come to mean by that time an arrangement of offices in a city, and that the Stranger is recommending a linguistic reform in the face of confusion about its meaning. But it is more plausible that the Stranger's concern is not changes in the use of language but in political practice: cities had become ruled by factions. A politeia truly so called -- i.e. one that unifies the city rather than dividing it against itself -- does not serve only the rulers but the whole community.

I will briefly summarize the remaining essays.

Aristotle's remarks on women in Politics I are the subject of Marguerite Deslauriers' very clear and well-argued essay ("Political rule over women in Politics I"). She starts from Aristotle's puzzling claim that the rule of the husband over the wife is 'political' -- a term normally reserved for rule over equals. This is hard to reconcile with other passages where his belief in the inferiority of women is evident. After carefully surveying the evidence, she concludes that women in the household have 'a voice but not a vote' -- they participate in deliberations without making decisions.

Politics I also contains a famous account of the sense in which humans are political animals and the way in which speech and reason (both translating logos) distinguish our political nature from that of the other animals. Jill Frank, in "On logos and politics in Aristotle", interprets logos, normally translated as 'reason', as 'speech', and gives an analysis of political speech and persuasion drawing on Aristotle's Rhetoric. On her view persuasion is both more active and communal than has otherwise been thought.

The second book of the Politics contains Aristotle's critique of previous regimes, real and imagined. In "Politics II: Political critique, political theorizing, political innovation", Thornton Lockwood argues that the book is more than a laundry list of complaints, and analyzes the structure of Politics II with an eye to questions about the role of political critique in political innovation.

Pierre Pellegrin in "Is politics a natural science?" considers whether the naturalness of the polis for Aristotle makes it an appropriate subject of a natural science, and concludes that the role of human agents in politics supports Aristotle's treatment of it as a practical science instead.

The quality of the hardcover is very poor -- a page came out when I first opened the book, and by the time I finished it the loose pages had multiplied many times. This seems to be a new development in the Critical Guide series; previous volumes have been competently bound. The publisher has done the authors and editors a great disservice to print such a poor quality book and at such a high price. Libraries ought to order the e-book version; those attached to paper like myself ought go to those libraries and print off what interests them.

This is a highly useful and interesting volume for scholars of Aristotle's political thought. Its merits far outweigh its faults, physical or otherwise.


My thanks to Kieran Setiya and Rachel Singpurwalla for their helpful comments on a draft of this review.

[1] The date of neither text is certain. For the Old Oligarch, the early date of 443 is defended in Bowersock's introduction to the Loeb edition (Xenophon. Scripta Minora. Loeb Classical Library 183. Harvard University Press, 1925.). For the later date of 425 see J.M. Moore, Aristotle and Xenophon on Democracy and Oligarchy, University of California Press,1986, p.20, with references. Herodotus' History is generally believed to have been published before 425, although some have speculated that parts were published later. See David Sansone, "The Date of Herodotus' Publication." Illinois Classical Studies Vol. 10, No. 1 (Spring, 1985), pp. 1-9; J. A. S. Evans , "Herodotus 9. 73. 3 and the Publication Date of the Histories." Classical Philology Vol. 82, No. 3 (Jul., 1987), pp. 226-228.