Aristotle's Revenge: The Metaphysical Foundations of Physical and Biological Science

Placeholder book cover

Edward Feser, Aristotle's Revenge: The Metaphysical Foundations of Physical and Biological Science, Editiones Scholasticae, 2019, 515pp, $29.90 (pbk), ISBN 9783868382006.

Reviewed by Monte Ransome Johnson, University of California, San Diego


"Scholasticism" usually refers to the presupposition of a single philosophy taught in the universities of late medieval Europe, a presupposition found useful by philosophers working outside those universities in the late sixteenth and early seventeenth centuries. As such "there is, strictly speaking, no such thing as Scholasticism",[1] but the tag "Scholasticism" was later adopted by self-styled neo-Scholastics of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries who remained committed to doctrines whose origins can be traced back to Aristotle. It may now be necessary to speak of neo-neo-Scholasticism, since Edward Feser attempts to revive neo-Scholasticism, presented as a sequel to his Scholastic Metaphysics: A Contemporary Introduction (Editiones Scholasticae, 2014). This new book "builds on the main ideas and arguments developed and defended there", and so the reader is advised that if some assumptions seem insufficiently defended "he will find the full-dress defense in the earlier book" (p. 2).

Feser presents a neo-neo-Scholastic account of contemporary philosophy of science, including philosophy of physics, chemistry, biology, and mind: "the central argument of this book is that Aristotelian metaphysics is not only compatible with modern science, but is implicitly presupposed by modern science" (p. 1). Feser aims to make these presuppositions explicit for leading contemporary scientific theories, including relativity, quantum mechanics, and evolution, which "in no way undermine the central ideas of Aristotelian philosophy of nature, and even presuppose those ideas in a very general way" (p. 1). In fact:

the very possibility of science presupposes the reality and irreducibility of the conscious, thinking, embodied subject. Hence we cannot coherently eliminate that subject from our conception of the world, especially not in the name of science. . . . we cannot in turn make sense of this subject without deploying the fundamental concepts of Aristotelian philosophy of nature, such as actuality and potentiality, form and matter, and efficient and final causality. If science as read through the lens of philosophical naturalism seems to imply otherwise, the problem is with naturalism and not with Aristotelianism. Thus does Aristotle have his revenge against those who claim to have overthrown him in the name of modern science. But he is a magnanimous victor, providing as he does the true metaphysical foundations for the very possibility of that science. (p. 456)

In this overall conclusion Feser refers to the fundamental concepts of Aristotelian philosophy of nature, Aristotelianism, and even Aristotle himself. But, as with Scholasticism and neo-Scholasticism, it is possible to call into question the fidelity of neo-neo-Scholasticism to Aristotle's own philosophy, and thus to wonder whether its efforts really deliver Aristotle's revenge. The point I am making is not just about the title of Feser's book. The true purpose of Feser's book, it seems, is not actually to avenge Aristotle, but to show how Aristotle affords concepts that can be adapted by neo-neo-Scholastics to combat certain metaphysical interpretations of contemporary science. But Feser himself does not explain his enterprise this way. Instead, he continually presents his views as embodying a kind of perennial "Aristotelian Philosophy".

This can be seen from a summary of the book's contents. In Chapter 1, "Two philosophies of nature", Feser contrasts Aristotelian philosophy of nature and the mechanical world picture. The former is characterized as an interlocking set of metaphysical commitments: actuality and potentiality, hylemorphism, efficient and final causality, and living substances" He considers the theory of actuality and potentiality to be "the core of Aristotelian philosophy of nature" (p. 15), but explains the theory with reference to form and matter, and thus hylemorphism, the doctrine that substances should be analyzed into their material (hylê) and form (morphê, which literally means shape, but is taken as equivalent to eidos or form): "matter is passive and indeterminate, form active and determinate. The same bit of matter can take on different forms, and the same form can be received in different bits of matter. Hence matter and form are distinct as potentiality and actuality" (p. 22). "Efficient and final causality" refers to the remaining two of Aristotle's four kinds of cause: besides material and formal causes, substances and their activities must be explained on the basis of moving or efficient causes and ends or final causes. Finally, "living substances" refers to Aristotle's view that plants, animals, and human beings constitute irreducible natural kinds: the explanation of plants and their functions (nutrition, growth, reproduction) cannot be reduced to the materials, movements and forms of inanimate things; animals and their functions (perception and self-movement) cannot be reduced to those of plants; and humans and their functions (reasoning and scientific knowledge) cannot be reduced to those of animals. Although Aristotle does not himself use terms like hylemorphism or final causality (these are scholastic labels), the doctrines are arguably attributable to Aristotle and the terminology is not necessarily misleading.

On the other hand, the polemical expression (also not used by Aristotle) the mechanical world picture (also: mechanical philosophy, mechanistic picture, and mechanistic world picture, all used on pp. 43-44) is potentially misleading, and so are other terms Feser frequently associates (or conflates) with it, including scientism, reductionism, materialism, and naturalism (it is especially jarring to see Aristotle opposed to naturalism, as in the above quotation). As Feser points out, "no Aristotelian has ever denied that natural objects are in some respects machine-like or that breaking down their parts and determining how those parts interact is part of a complete explanation" (p. 43). Some recent studies have explored Aristotle's own innovative approach to mechanics and biomechanical explanation.[2] But Feser seems uninterested in any mechanistic aspects of Aristotle's thought, and unaware of the fact that Aristotle, or some earlier member of his school following his methods, authored the oldest extant textbook on Mechanical Problems, a work demonstrably influential on Descartes.[3] According to Feser, the mechanistic picture holds that:

a natural object is to be understood on the model of a machine or artifact, and therefore not in terms of substantial form or intrinsic teleology. Thus of Aristotle's four causes, the mechanistic picture effectively rejects formal and final cause, and also radically redefines material and efficient cause . . . In turn, other ideas of the Aristotelian philosophy of nature, such as the idea of a hierarchy of irreducibly different kinds of natural substance and the theory of actuality and potentiality, are explicitly or implicitly abandoned as well. (p. 44).

Thus Feser defines the mechanical world picture entirely negatively as a set of doctrines precisely contrary to the Aristotelian philosophy of nature. Not attributed to anyone specifically, it is associated with Descartes, Gassendi, and Hobbes, who "adhered instead to the traditional atomist picture", and corpuscularians like Locke and Boyle, who "modified atomism" (pp. 44-45).[4] Ancient atomism is occasionally mentioned by Feser, but always in connection with the modern mechanistic picture, and always very critically, without acknowledging Aristotle's own attitude towards the natural science of the atomist Democritus:

with the single exception of Democritus, not one of our predecessors penetrated below the surface or made a thorough examination of a single one of the problems. Democritus, however, seems not only to have thought carefully about all the problems, but also to be distinguished from the outset by his method. (On Generation and Destruction I.2.315a32-b15)

Feser displays no interest in the aspects of traditional atomism that Aristotle approved, or of the modern mechanistic philosophy that he could have approved.[5] The relationship between Aristotle and mechanical philosophy is reduced to the rejection of teleology: "arguably the fundamental and non-negotiable component of the mechanical world picture's critique of Aristotelianism", he writes, is that "teleology or final cause is for the mechanical philosophy no more really a part of the objective natural world than substantial form is" (p. 46). The fact that the early modern figures did apply final causality to human beings, to God, and to their accounts of the laws of nature, while readily acknowledged by Feser (p. 50), is not discussed much by him, except in order to assert that "an atheistic version of the mechanical world picture is incoherent" (p. 51). Feser's position is not argued but rather expressed in a series of rhetorical questions, such as: "If there is no God and no substantial forms either, how can we make sense of the operation of laws of nature?" (p. 51).

Chapter 2, "The scientists and scientific method", opens with a roadmap:

the chapters to follow will argue that the results of modern science not only in no way conflict with the central claims of Aristotelian philosophy of nature, but in some respects even vindicate those claims . . . the very methods of modern science vindicate those claims -- and in an even more decisive way. (p. 65).

Even more decisive than what? Than Aristotle's own arguments? The plural "methods" here is confusing: Feser's expression seemingly randomly varies between methods of modern science, the scientific method and scientific method (p. 65). The chapter, however, is not much concerned with scientific method, but rather with the argument that "Science is . . . committed to a version of the principle of sufficient reason." (p. 75). According to Feser, although the principle cannot be directly proven, it can be "demonstrated by the indirect method of proof known as reductio ad absurdum" (p. 76). Such proofs Feser later calls retorsion arguments, viz., arguments that attempt to refute a claim by showing that anyone making it is led thereby into a performative self-contradiction. The retorsion "strategy" (Feser's term) is repeatedly deployed to show that various reductionist and eliminativist proposals are absurd or self-contradictory: "thus, the very existence of scientists qua subjects of experience presupposes the fundamental thesis of Aristotelian philosophy of nature" (p. 88); "the manifest image, the world as it appears from the 'subjective' point of view of the conscious subject, cannot coherently be eliminated and replaced entirely by the 'objective' or 'absolute' perspective of the scientific image" (p. 134). After several deployments of the retorsion strategy, Feser concludes:

the point is just that it will not do for naturalists and other proponents of a mechanistic picture of nature to wave away appeals to teleology, potentiality, and other Aristotelian notions with the glib assurance that modern science has banished them once and for all. Science has done no such thing. (p. 138)

Although Feser is aware that "some have questioned the probative force of such arguments" (p. 80), he does not mention that Aristotle was chief among them. Aristotle holds that indirect reductio arguments are inferior to direct negative arguments, which are in turn inferior to direct positive arguments (Posterior Analytics I.26); reductio arguments must fall far short of demonstrative knowledge (as defined in Posterior Analytics I.2), since its premises are not only not prior to, not better known than, and not explanatory of their conclusions, but they are not even true! But in chapter 3 ("Science and reality"), Feser unhesitatingly extends his application of retorsion:

in the previous chapter it was argued that the scientific image of the world presupposes the existence of something that is not captured by it, namely the scientist himself qua conscious and thinking subject. . . . But does the scientific image at least capture everything else in nature, everything beyond the conscious thinking subject?" (p. 139)

Unsurprisingly, Feser answers his question in the negative.

The retorsion arguments defended in earlier chapters claim to show that the denial that change occurs and the denial that everything is intelligible each entail a contradiction. They are reductio ad absurdum arguments purporting to establish truths about objective reality, not mere appeals to how we contingently happen to carve up the world conceptually. (p. 150)

So Feser thinks that his retorsion arguments taken together undergird a positive doctrine he calls epistemic structural realism (p. 151f.). The explanation of this doctrine involves an extensive engagement with many eminent philosophers and scientists before Feser concludes that:

the methods of empiriometric science also cannot capture all that there is to the nature of the physical world external to the conscious and thinking subject. Since it cannot do so, the absence from empiriometric science of any reference to the basic Aristotelian concepts in question by itself gives no reason whatsoever to conclude that those concepts don't in fact have application to the external physical world. Indeed, since we know that they do have application to the conscious, thinking subject, and that that subject is part of the physical world, we have reason to expect that the concepts do have application also to the wider physical world. (p. 194)

The remaining chapters, then, are devoted to showing "exactly how far they apply to that wider world" (p. 194). Chapter 4 shows how far Aristotelian notions apply to "Space, Time, and Motion". Chapter 5 provides the same service for what Feser calls the philosophy of matter, which includes a discussion of Aristotle and quantum mechanics, an anti-reductionist account of chemistry, and a positive answer to the question: Is computation intrinsic to physics? followed by an interesting section entitled "Aristotle and computationalism" (pp. 366-374).

Chapter 6, "Animate nature", contains a continuous argument against biological reductionism and a defense of function and teleology and the hierarchy of life forms. Feser argues not only that Aristotelian natural philosophy is fully compatible with evolutionary theory, but that evolutionary theory actually presupposes Aristotelian metaphysical concepts, such as species essentialism. It turns out that natural selection is teleological (pp. 406-420), and in fact "evolution itself requires rather than undermines Aristotelian essentialism and teleology" (p. 432). The chapter ends with "Problems with some versions of 'intelligent design' theory".

Having described the contents of the book, I will discuss what I see as its major limitation. Although Feser frequently refers to Aristotelian philosophy of nature and presents his account as vindicating Aristotle, there is vanishingly little discussion of Aristotle's own arguments. Only a single work of Aristotle is cited in the bibliography: R. P. Hardie and R. K. Gaye's translation of the Physics (Oxford, 1930). But Feser says:

I am not talking about Aristotle's ideas in Physics, as that discipline is understood today. . . . I am talking about the philosophical ideas that can be disentangled from this outdated scientific framework, such as the theory of actuality and potentiality and the doctrine of the four causes. These are, again, metaphysical ideas rather than scientific ones. Or to be more precise, they are ideas in the philosophy of nature, which I regard as a sub-discipline within metaphysics. (p. 1)

Feser departs from Aristotle's division of philosophy and the sciences, according to which theology (first philosophy) is considered an autonomous theoretical science, alongside mathematics and natural science (second philosophy). Feser makes philosophy of nature a subdivision of metaphysics, unlike Aristotle, who treats natural science as an autonomous science, or rather a series of autonomous sciences (meteorology, psychology, zoology, etc.). Aristotle discusses the principles, definitions, and dialectical background for each natural science at the beginning of his inquires in each of these sciences. According to the agenda announced in Meteorology I.1, natural science commences with a general account of nature and motion in the Physics, and proceeds to the specific inquiries into the elements, the universe, the meteors, and the plants and animals. Metaphysics as such does not appear on this agenda, and there is no indication that Aristotle embraces a superordinate science supplying "metaphysical foundations of physical and biological science" (the subtitle of Feser's book). One might, in fact, follow the ancient editor of Aristotle's works who placed the abstract discussions of potentiality and actuality (etc.) after the works on natural science (thus inadvertently inventing the expression "meta-physics"). For his part, Feser does not seem interested in Aristotle's own philosophy of science or method of inquiry: there is no discussion of the Posterior Analytics, or of any other discussion of scientific methodology in Aristotle, such as those found in the openings of Physics, On the Soul, or On the Parts of Animals.

Feser also ignores outstanding scholarship in the history of philosophy on the relationship between Aristotle's and contemporary natural science, such as the monumental studies of Wolfgang Kullman, Aristoteles und die moderne Wissenschaft (Freiburg, 1981), and Aristoteles als Naturwissenschaftler (Berlin, 2014). Nor does Feser notice the papers in the two-volume anthology edited by Demetra Sfendoni-Mentzou, Aristotle and Contemporary Science (New York, 2000-2001). Despite Feser's estimation of it as an "outdated scientific framework", even Aristotle's physics has had important defenders, including Carlo Rovelli's astonishing article "Aristotle's Physics -- A Physicist's Look".[6] But Feser does not notice this article. Nor does he notice other well-known defenses of Aristotelian biology, such as Nobel Laureate Max Delbrück's half-serious suggestion that the Nobel committee "should consider Aristotle for the discovery of the principle implied in DNA".[7] Nor does Feser mention Armond Leroy, a contemporary evolutionary biologist who praises Aristotle's accounts of metabolic processes, temperature homeostasis, information processing, inheritance, and embryonic development, and an author whose book has an even more pretentious subtitle than Feser's: The Lagoon: How Aristotle Invented Science (London, 2014). Nor does Feser mention the eminent biologist Ernst Mayr's admission, "I myself misinterpreted Aristotle before I became acquainted with the contemporary literature".[8] Nor does Feser engage with important attempts to defend Aristotle's general philosophy of science, such as Bas Van Fraassen's "A Re-examination of Aristotle's Philosophy of Science",[9] or Paul Feyerabend's classic "Aristotle Not a Dead Dog".[10] This is surprising because Feser does cite less relevant works of Mayr, Van Fraassen, and Feyerabend. I assume that Feser does not refer to such relevant work because the interpretations of Aristotle contained in them do not fit well with other doctrinal commitments of neo-neo-Scholasticism.

Given the lack of references to primary and secondary sources for Aristotle's views, the position defended in Aristotle's Revenge is better described, as Feser frequently does, as neo-Aristotelian or, more accurately, Aristotelian-Thomistic philosophy. When he contrasts Platonic teleological realism with both Aristotelian teleological realism and scholastic teleological realism (p. 417), one gets the strong impression that his true sympathies lie with the scholastic as opposed to the Aristotelian version. Feser offers an elaborate defense of a vast synthetic doctrine and set of dogmatic argumentative schemas that he glorifies with the honorific title Aristotelian philosophy of nature. But his philosophy bears little resemblance to the texts and arguments of the Stagirite. Why then does Feser connect his enterprise to Aristotle at all? The following remark seems to provide an answer:

the theory of actuality and potentiality . . . is not only central to Aristotelian philosophy of nature, but also to Aristotelian-Thomistic metaphysics. But it is utterly unknown to most contemporary physicists and inessential to dealing with the issues they are typically concerned with. Consequently, while it is fairly easy to transition from the study of Aristotelian philosophy of nature to that of Aristotelian-Thomistic metaphysics and vice versa, there is nothing in contemporary physics to orient one to the study of Aristotelian philosophy of nature and nothing in Aristotelian philosophy of nature to orient one to the study of contemporary physics. (p. 8)

The claim that there is "nothing in Aristotelian philosophy of nature to orient one to the study of contemporary physics" is odd. As mentioned above, there is plenty of work in the history and philosophy of science relating Aristotle's philosophy not only to contemporary physics, but to the larger history of science. Whereas Feser would have students of physics and of Aristotle oriented to each other's fields through Aristotelian-Thomistic metaphysics, I would rather have them oriented through the history of science, for example, by an account of how the Aristotelian energeia relates to the concept of energy, or dunamis to dynamics; or how when mass is defined as quantity of matter, it is conceived through originally Aristotelian categories and distinctions.[11]

Feser's book lacks any account of the influence of Aristotelian philosophy even on Thomistic metaphysics, much less on contemporary physics. Instead, Feser compares Aristotelian metaphysics immediately with contemporary physics, as here:

I am certainly not claiming that all of this points in an Aristotelian direction. Indeed, some of it is decidedly un-Aristotelian (such as the "many worlds" interpretation . . . ). The idea is rather this. As we have seen, on the most natural interpretation of relativity . . . the theory describes a world that is entirely actual and devoid of potentiality. By contrast, on the most natural interpretation of quantum mechanics . . . the theory describes a world that is merely potential until actualized with the collapse of the wave function, and where parts exist virtually rather than actually in the wholes of which they are parts. In other words, it can be read as recapitulating Aristotelian hylemorphism and the theory of actuality and potentiality that is at the core of hylemorphism. (p. 311)

If I follow Feser's account, the theory of relativity has no place for the notion of potentiality, and quantum mechanics none for actuality. Far from this being an anti-Aristotelian turn for contemporary physics, since accepting the theory of relativity requires us to accept actuality, and quantum mechanics potentiality, accepting both (the best theories in physics) requires us to accept the theory of potentiality and actuality (the core of Aristotelian-Thomistic metaphysics). But if the theories themselves make no use of the theory of potentiality and actuality, then why would contemporary metaphysics need Aristotelian-Thomistic metaphysics? It is not as if the theory of potentiality and actuality somehow unifies relativity and quantum mechanics, and I do not think that Feser means to claim that it does. But it is not clear that the theory of potentiality and actuality offers anything whatsoever to the interpretation of these theories, at least not in a historical vacuum.

Feser's book could be useful to those interested in defending anti-reductionist positions in various disputes in philosophy of science. But as he rightly remarks:

a neo-Aristotelian defense of the irreducibility of sentient and rational forms of life can call upon a large and impressive body of contemporary antireductionist argumentation that was developed almost entirely independently of any Aristotelian influence or motivation. (p. 398)

Feser's impressive grasp of this anti-reductionist literature makes him a formidable polemicist, able to sift the avalanche of philosophy of science literature and find the concepts he is looking for. But, as he admits, contemporary philosophers can use the anti-reductionist literature without accepting any Aristotelian or neo-Aristotelian doctrines, much less Aristotelian-Thomistic or neo-Scholastic ones. Feser does not encourage contemporary philosophers to look into Aristotle's positive account, and in fact, as with Aristotle's Physics ("this outdated scientific framework"), actually discourages this. Feser's book, therefore, will be most useful to those philosophers who, like its author, are already committed to neo-neo-Scholasticism, and who want briefs on contemporary topics in the philosophy of science.

[1] C. Normore, "Scholasticism", The Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy, ed. R. Audi, 1995.

[2] See my "Aristotelian Mechanistic Explanation", in Teleology in the Ancient World: Philosophical and Medical Approaches, ed. J. Rocca (Cambridge, 2017) p. 125-150; and my review of Jean De Groot, Aristotle's Empiricism: Experience and Mechanics in the 4th Century BC (Las Vegas, 2014), in Ancient Philosophy 35 (2015), p. 220-230. I highly recommend: S. Berryman, The Mechanical Hypothesis in Ancient Greek Natural Philosophy (Cambridge, 2009).

[3] See H. Hattab, "From Mechanics to Mechanism: the Quaestiones Mechanicae and Descartes' Physics", in The Science of Nature in the Seventeenth Century, ed. P. R. Anstey and J. A. Schuster (Dordrecht, 2005), p. 99-130.

[4] Feser's "mechanistic world picture" takes after the superannuated account of E. J. Dijksterhuis, The Mechanization of the World Picture (originally published Amsterdam, 1950; English translation by C. Dikshoorn, Oxford, 1961). But this is not included in the bibliography.

[5] By contrast, see a study like C. Leijenhorst, The Mechanization of Aristotelianism: The Late Aristotelian Setting of Thomas Hobbes' Natural Philosophy (Leiden, 2002).

[6] Journal of the American Philosophical Association I (2015), p. 23-40.

[7] ‘Aristotle-totle-totle', in J. Monod and E. Borek, eds. Microbes and Life (New York, 1971), p. 50–5.

[8] Toward a New Philosophy of Biology (Cambridge, 1988), p. 61.

[9] Dialogue IX (1980), p. 20-45.

[10] Science in a Free Society (London, 1978), p. 53-64.

[11] The possibility of a conceptual and historico-linguistic analysis of this definition of mass is mentioned by L. Minio-Paluello in "Aristotle: Tradition and Influence", Dictionary of Scientific Biography Volume 1, ed. C. C. Gillespie (New York, 1970), p. 67-281.