Aristotle's Theory of Bodies

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Christian Pfeiffer, Aristotle's Theory of Bodies, Oxford University Press, 2018, 230pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198779728.

Reviewed by Andrea Falcon, Concordia University Montreal


In this book, Christian Pfeiffer argues that a coherent and exhaustive theory of body can be extracted from Aristotle's extant writings. Here 'body' is understood as a three-dimensionally extended and continuous magnitude bounded by surfaces, and 'theory' as a set of propositions articulating how Aristotle thinks, not only about body, but also about related notions such as magnitude, boundary, extension, contact, and continuity.

The book is divided into two parts. The first argues that Aristotle's theory of body is an integral part of Aristotle's physical science (aka natural science or natural philosophy) rather than mathematics. The second develops this theory through a careful study of the relevant concepts as they are discussed or used in Aristotle's extant works (not only the physical writings but also works such as the Categories and the Metaphysics). Pfeiffer conveniently recapitulates the main results in the second part in Appendix B. Appendix A is an in-depth discussion of Metaphysics V 13, which, along with Categories 6, is the most important source for Aristotle's theory of quantity. Pfeiffer argues that a coherent theory of quantity can be extracted from these two texts.

A main concern of Pfeiffer's in the first part (chapters 2, 3, and 4) is to establish that Aristotle's theory of body is developed for his physical science and so finds its primary application in the study of the physical world. How would a theory of body fit into the Aristotelian project of investigation of the physical world? We are repeatedly invited to think of such a theory in light of what Aristotle achieves in Physics III and IV, where change, the infinite, place, void, and time are discussed in this order. Recall, in particular, how Aristotle himself introduces his discussion. He tells us that change, the infinite, place, void, and time are to be discussed prior to engaging in the study of any particular part or aspect of the physical world. In other words, we cannot embark in a successful study of the physical world without a firm grasp of concepts such as change, the infinite, place, void, and time. Likewise, we cannot launch an optimal investigation of the natural world without a prior understanding of body and related notions. If understood in this way, Aristotle's theory of body would be a sort of prolegomenon to his entire project of investigation of the physical world.

Let me pause to react to Pfeiffer's main claim in the first part. I do not dispute that Aristotle has a sophisticated conception of body and that his various remarks and observations on this topic can be shaped into a full-fledged theory of the sort developed in the second part. I also agree that a firm grasp of such a theory greatly enhances our appreciation of several claims that Aristotle makes in the course of his study of the physical world. However, I am not convinced that Aristotle ever planned to give us a general and self-contained treatment of body as a distinct part of his physical theory. As a result, I am not persuaded that the theory of body Pfeiffer develops here can be considered on a par with Aristotle's general treatment of change, the infinite, void, and time (Physics III and IV). To begin with, I do not find compelling evidence that Aristotle is in need of a general and self-contained treatment of body as a complement to his general account of form and matter (Physics II), or to his discussion of change, the infinite, void, and time (Physics III and IV). By "compelling evidence" I mean methodological remarks suggesting that a general treatment of body is required to complete his physical theory. Furthermore, while I agree that the theory of body developed by Pfeiffer is geared to the study of physical substances, I am not convinced that his theory has its home in Aristotle's physical science. Prima facie evidence to the contrary is the fact that the key texts used to reconstruct this theory have a diverse provenance. Many, if not most of them, come from the Physics, the Metaphysics, and the Categories. The best characterization of this theory is found in Appendix B where it is described as "the outcome of a general philosophical investigation of the concept of body" (p. 211).

It is time to turn to the second part (chapters 5, 6, and 7). This is the more convincing part of the book. Pfeiffer collects, discusses, and arranges, in a compelling way, all the texts that contribute, directly and immediately, to the project of showing that Aristotle has a theory of body. His first step is a full discussion of Categories 6. According to Aristotle, body is in the category of quantity. More precisely, they are discrete quantities and are quantities the parts of which have a position with respect to one another. A careful analysis of the Aristotelian divisions made in Categories 6 yields a general definition of body and serves to introduce key concepts such as continuity, extension, and position.

The next step is an analysis of Aristotle's claim that body, in virtue of being extended in three dimensions, is a complete/perfect (teleion) magnitude. This claim is taken to have a normative meaning. Bodies have a privileged position among magnitudes in the sense that they are prior to one- and two-dimensional magnitudes in Aristotle's theoretical framework. It is notoriously difficult to understand how this priority claim can be established. Pfeiffer suggests that the priority Aristotle has in mind can be elucidated by relying on the model of natural generation. Contrary to Plato, Aristotle does not admit the transition from one kind of magnitude to another. As a result, there cannot be, strictly speaking, a generation of bodies out of lower-level magnitudes (surfaces and lines). Still, Aristotle seems to be willing to consider three-dimensional magnitudes as the endpoint of a quasi-natural process of generation. Note, however, that in order to establish that bodies are dimensionally complete and perfect magnitudes we need to secure that there are no more than three dimensions and that being extended in three dimensions is equivalent to being extended in all dimensions. This claim can be secured only in the context of a theory that considers body insofar as it is the body of a physical substance. As such, it can serve as a vivid example of what it means for a theory of body to be geared toward the study of the physical world.

Bodies have both boundaries and extension. We can think of boundaries and extension as per se properties of body. Hence, Aristotle's theory of body is further expanded by exploring how Aristotle thinks about boundaries and extension. Among other things, Pfeiffer explores the relation between boundaries and bodies, as well as the ontological dependence of boundaries on bodies. But how does Aristotle conceive of extension? It is argued that the extension of an object is what lies between the boundaries of the object. As such, the extension of an object is the ordinary matter of the object considered in an abstract way. In other words, it is separable in definition but it is not ontologically separable from matter.

Pfeiffer's final topic is a study of the Aristotelian treatment of continuity and contact. This entails a shift from the study of the features of a single body to the analysis of the interrelation between bodies. He argues that continuity is a kind of unity and involves the relation between the parts of a single object, whereas contact is a relation that holds between ontologically independent objects. Pfeiffer applies great deal of ingenuity to show that these concepts are primarily developed for the study of the physical world. This discussion illustrates how the theory of bodies extracted from the Aristotle's extant works is controlled by his overarching analysis of physical substances.

The second part is philosophically very rich and insightful. It consists of an in-depth study of Aristotle's views on topics such as the ontology of boundaries and extension and the distinction between continuity and contact. By collecting and discussing passages that are scattered over several texts Pfeiffer shows -- by my lights, successfully and convincingly -- that a unified, and indeed elegant, theory of bodies can be extracted from the Aristotelian corpus. While Pfeiffer's primary goal in the second part is to offer an accurate reconstruction of how Aristotle thinks about bodies, the conceptual work he does in the course of this historical reconstruction has a theoretical relevance that goes emphatically beyond the narrow boundaries of ancient philosophy. The book as a whole is relevant to readers who are interested in contemporary metaphysics and mereology.