Art and Abstract Objects

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Christy Mag Uidhir (ed.), Art and Abstract Objects, Oxford University Press, 2012, 310pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199691494.

Reviewed by Robert Howell, University at Albany, SUNY/Moscow State University


This is a very interesting anthology on a set of topics at the center of the now lively research area where analytic philosophy of art and contemporary metaphysics meet. It contains work by (in order of appearance): Guy Rohrbaugh, Jerrold Levinson, Marcus Rossberg, Roy Cook, P. D. Magnus, Shieva Kleinschmidt and Jacob Ross, Allan Hazlett, Ross Cameron, Andrew Kania, Hud Hudson, Sherri Irvin, David Davies, and Joseph Moore. The editor contributes a substantive introduction. All the essays repay attention, and everyone concerned with this area should read this book.

At least three basic issues have animated research on ontology of art in the past 50 or so years: (i) the nature of repeatable works (such as poems and symphonies with many instances or performances) and of our talk about them; (ii) the question whether all artworks are in principle repeatable, including apparently singular works such as paintings, sculptures, and musical improvisations; and (iii) the ontological status of purely fictional objects such as Hamlet and Anna Karenina. As the essays in the present anthology show, an implicit consensus seems to have developed that (as I agree) paintings and other apparent singular works belong to a different ontological category from repeatable works, if repeatable works are, indeed, a sort of abstract, generic thing. The present authors don't argue about (ii) but instead focus their attention mainly on (i), with one important essay directed at (iii).

For simplicity, in considering (i), I'll focus mostly on the example of repeatable musical works, as it has seen the most discussion. But my points apply, mutatis mutandis, to literary and other kinds of repeatable works. I'll also assume that readers of this review will recall the basic history that lies behind the present essays: pure-structural-type (or norm-kind) views of repeatable works proposed by Richard Wollheim, Nicholas Wolterstorff, and Peter Kivy were subsequently overturned by Jerrold Levinson's well-known contextualist approach to such works. But Levinson's positive idea that, say, a symphony is a created, quasi-abstract thing, an 'indicated type,' was criticized for making it a mystery how a composer's act of directing attention to a structural type could generate a wholly new entity. Somewhat later, Amie Thomasson argued that repeatable works are abstract artifacts brought into existence by the composer's engaging in the right compositional practices. Like Levinson's, her ideas remain deservedly influential. But critics responded that it isn't clear how engaging in a practice can generate a new, abstract entity, particularly given questions about how abstract entities can fit into the causal nexus.

At this point, Guy Rohrbaugh observed that repeatable works are in fact modally and temporally flexible (and temporal) in ways that no sort of type can be. He proposed that, instead, such works are historical individuals, higher-level, spatiotemporal continuants that are embodied in their concrete manifestations (performances, and so on) and can enter into causal relations. Critics like Julian Dodd (a defender of pure-type views) objected that such individuals are metaphysically obscure. But the idea took hold that a repeatable work is some sort of spatiotemporally-lodged individual and not abstract in any problematic way at all. Soon sophisticated defenses of 'musical materialism' were appearing (discussed, but unfortunately not represented, in the present volume) -- notably, Ben Caplan and Carl Matheson's suggestion that musical works are mereological fusions of their performances and related work by Chris Tillman (and Joshua Spencer) and by Peter Alward. A bit earlier, David Davies had boldly proposed identifying a repeatable work with a concrete action token (produced by the composer) that manipulates the medium and specifies a focus of appreciation.

Eliminativist and fictionalist ideas from general metaphysics also began to spill over into these discussions. Ross Cameron defended a general elimination of repeatable works at the level of fundamental ontology, given the conflict between abstraction and creatability. And Andrew Kania argued for the revolutionary fictionalist idea that, while our various claims about repeatable works are literally false (given that conflict and related problems), we can and should reinterpret those claims as expressing merely the fiction that such works exist, a fiction that allows us to preserve all the usefulness of our current artistic practices.

The core of the present volume is a series of essays concerned with the above issues. Levinson offers a helpful new account of indicated types, and Rohrbaugh surveys the present state of the discussion in a magisterial way (with illuminating remarks on major previous ideas, including other essays in the present anthology and important forthcoming doubts by Robert Kraut about the whole ontology-of-art project). Levinson proposes that acts of indication create repeatable works by ordaining a rule that performers are to follow, thereby establishing a miniature performance practice that brings into being an indicated type. He suggests that an indicated type isn't itself really a structural type at all but a Wollheimian generic entity. Rohrbaugh expresses sympathy with Magnus's idea (see below) that repeatable musical works are analogous to the historical individuals with which many philosophers of biology now identify species. Adopting part of Levinson's new proposal, Rohrbaugh then suggests that his historical individuals should be identified with the particular practices that the composer brings into existence, practices that can be manifested over and over in performance.

Taking off from Wollheim's original account of types, Davies provides a sensitive account of the ontology of films that in the end follows his earlier view. (He identifies Citizen Kane with a token generative action that brings into existence an artifact that enables multiple screenings of the work.) In an enlightening discussion, Magnus defends Rohrbaugh's historical-individual idea against charges of ontological incoherence by noting that a similar idea is now commonplace in discussions of species in philosophy of biology.[1] Following Richard Boyd's work, he suggests that biological species, as such individuals, are homeostatic property clusters unified by single token causal histories that trace back to an originating cause. Causally continuous processes ensure that the property clusters are maintained (and play out over time) in the particular members of the species. Repeatable artworks should be understood similarly. Performances of such a work all share a single, distal cause, the work's original act of composition, and they exemplify a similar cluster of sound patterns through their membership in the same token causal history that develops from that act.

Rossberg and Hazlett explore explicitly nominalist projects. Rossberg, focusing on computer art, investigates the creation and destruction of repeatable artworks. He concludes that there is no way of allowing for the creation and destruction of such works, considered as abstracta, that is not ontologically excessive. He proposes that repeatable works are best understood as equivalence classes of concreta (for example, of token performances), such classes themselves then being dispensable in one way or another. Hazlett denies the existence of repeatable works, considered as abstract objects, for, he argues, all such objects have their intrinsic properties essentially, but repeatable works would be modally flexible in their intrinsic properties. In their place, he offers various substitutes -- for example, that each performance is a distinct work of art, united with the other performances only by intrinsic similarity and a common origin; or that the original artwork is just the original token created by the artist, all the other 'instances' simply being token copies of that original.

To jump momentarily to the sole paper focusing on fictional objects, Cameron extends his eliminativism about repeatable works to a defense of fictional realism against Anthony Everett (2005)'s Frick-Frack criticism. A story might leave the identity or not of Frick and Frack open, and so fictional realists ought to take the actual-world identity, or not, of the Frick and Frack fictional objects itself to be indeterminate. But actual-world identities can't be indeterminate, so fictional realism fails. Cameron responds that at least one of the names here is indeterminate in reference. In a Frick-Frack case, there are, in actual reality, multiple fictional characters for the name rigidly to refer to (with each precisification of the name associated with a different work of fiction), and no actual indeterminacies of identity arise.

To return to repeatable works, Kania offers a thoughtful defense of his revolutionary fictionalism, along with a very useful discussion of the methodological issues involved in balancing the implications of art practices with the requirements of current metaphysical views. He provides many helpful comparisons of his views with others. Irvin, who has an insider's knowledge of the art that she discusses, explores the ontology of installation and performance art from a realist perspective. Relying partly on Thomasson's theory, she concludes that installation works are typically quasi-abstract entities that are nonphysical and capable of instantiation. She also gives a plausible account of the conditions under which realizations of repeatable works will count as particular works themselves. In a very carefully argued, comprehensive paper, Kleinschmidt and Ross compare sentences about repeatable artworks, such as "The Moonlight Sonata has three movements," with sentences such as "the polar bear has four paws" understood generically. Building on earlier work on generics, and introducing both a generic operator and a collective operator governing property-application to objects, they construct a detailed semantics for generic sentences that allows one to be an eliminativist about such alleged entities as the type Polar Bear. They suggest that the same sort of semantics applies to sentences about repeatable artworks. So we have reasons for being eliminativists about such artworks, too.

In an original discussion, Moore argues that our concept of a work of repeatable music involves two conditions that can come apart -- sameness of sound structure and sameness of provenance. When these conditions separate (for example, in hypothetical cases in which we have works with the same structure but different provenances), we will have indeterminacy about work identity. In such cases, there will be no hidden factors that can resolve the indeterminacy. But the indeterminacy is in our work concept, not in the world. Moore argues in the end for a uniform, supervaluationist way of understanding our claims about works. He recognizes, as associated with our talk of a single, ordinary musical work, two determinate sorts of work, a sound structure and a provenancial work. In our usual applications of the work concept, we tacitly presuppose that our talk of a musical work picks out a single, unitary, metaphysically unproblematic entity. When the conditions come apart, this pretense may be exposed. But it remains actually true that musical works exist, because on each sharpening of the work concept the relevant entity (the structural work or the provenancial work) exists and is referred to. So we still have a kind of realism about musical works, a realism that is unlike both Cameron's eliminativism and Kania's fictionalism.

Finally, and to complete this conspectus, in his introduction Mag Uidhir examines at length how far ontology of art should defer to ideas in contemporary metaphysics, or conversely. He concludes, sensibly, that there ought to be reciprocity. Hudson explores the ontology of sculptures through a series of imaginative counterexamples to various natural views about what is essential to something's being a sculpture. The odd man out, Cook, doesn't directly discuss ontology of art. Rather, and accepting the view that art is a family-resemblance concept, he compares the open-endedness in such concepts with two kinds of indefinite extensibility in mathematics (resulting from the set-theoretic paradoxes and from Gödelian-incompleteness). He argues that the open-endedness of the art concept allows for certain precise, necessary-and-sufficient-condition definitions of that concept. Our inability to specify exactly which objects are (or will or can be) art is epistemological, not a consequence of some metaphysical indeterminacy in the class of artworks themselves.[2]

* * * * * * * * * *

What conclusions should we now draw about the current state of ontology of art, given the above papers? We are surely not close to discovering any clear, generally acceptable view of repeatable works. Simple structural-type views appear to have had their day. But realism in the form of some historical-individuals view may still be defensible. Eliminativisms and especially fictionalist views also look increasingly promising.

Outright nominalists about repeatable artworks like Rossberg and Hazlett argue forcefully. And if they conjoin their programs with some sort of eliminativist or fictionalist account of our actual, apparently realist talk of (and quantification over) repeatable works (or related abstracta, such as type sound and word sequences), then conceivably these programs -- now understood as forms of eliminativism or fictionalism -- may turn out to be defensible. But, to be plausible, the eliminativism or fictionalism would have to be worked out in at least the kind of detail that, for example, Kendall Walton has provided in defending pretense theories of fictional objects (and that Stephen Yablo has supplied in his fictionalism about the natural numbers). Such accounts would need to show in detail that we can fictionalize away all the claims about types and similar abstracta (including, in this context, repeatable works) that Linda Wetzel (2009) assembles to show that we are ineliminably committed to such entities (given that past attempts simply to paraphrase these claims away have failed). Nothing like this has been done.

As it is, Hazlett's idea that each token performance of, say, a musical work might be a distinct work of art (or just the original, first-token performance might be the work) is open to Irvin's objection in the present volume that (given our usual, and deeply embedded, artistic practices) we take it that any actual tokens may not do justice to (may not, through their features, provide sufficient grounds for the presence of) the full potential that belongs to the work itself. A similar objection applies to Rossberg's assertion that we can do without types of the creatable or destructible sort (for example, impure types) because we only ever essentially appeal to concrete tokens. (As Irvin further notes, the actual tokens available will also share many accidental features that may not belong to the works, for example the fonts in which the tokens are printed. And of course there are traditional worries about how, without appeal to abstract entities, we are to collect together all the same-work tokens that are supposedly united merely by similarity relations.)[3] Until nominalists come up with some plausible, detailed fictionalist or other anti-realist story of why our practices here proceed as they do, and until they provide a similar story to defuse Wetzel's and others' defenses of realism about abstracta, they really have no convincing answers to objections such as Irvin's.[4]

However, the present volume doesn't contain any knockdown defenses of realism about repeatable works, either. Levinson's views have fueled a generation's discussion of such works, and I think that his contextualism about repeatable works is correct. In his current essay, he makes characteristically subtle points. But, tantalizing as the indicated-type idea remains, it is hard to see exactly what such types might be. (I don't think my own earlier idea of a 'type-in-use' -- an idea that Robert Stecker has also defended -- solves the problems, for example.) It continues to be a puzzle how establishing a practice can somehow generate a genuinely new, abstract entity (a puzzle that also affects Thomasson's account). And modal flexibility in any case prevents repeatable works from turning out to be type-like entities. Considered as a realist theory about repeatable works, musical materialism in its various forms also is open to many objections. (See, for example, Irvin's and Kleinschmidt and Ross's essays.) And, despite his valiant arguments, Davies has convinced few that Beethoven's token act of composition is the proper object to identify with the Fifth Symphony.

These facts suggest that realists about repeatable works should focus on developing a detailed, acceptable version of the historical-individual idea, maybe in Magnus's way, or by adopting Rohrbaugh's idea of a practice. However, I'm not clear about the exact nature of Magnus's homeostatic property clusters or exactly how they relate to the concrete individuals that embody them. (A property cluster on its face is quite different from a cluster-embodying concrete individual thing or a fusion of such things.) As Rohrbaugh notes, metaphysical doubts about his own historical individuals may also go on to infect the biological conception of historical individuals, and the biologists themselves don't seem to agree on the detailed metaphysics of such individuals. In addition, we find the nominalist Hazlett roundly declaring in his paper that Magnus's kind of view is wrong and that, in contemporary biology, species are regarded simply as groups of related organisms.

Rohrbaugh stresses that his idea of individual, token practices allows for the requisite modal and temporal flexibility and temporality of repeatable works. But if we agree that musical works can themselves be heard (and not simply in the sense that we hear just concrete individual performances with no awareness of the work that they realize), then I'm not clear that, or how, one can hear a practice, itself. It also isn't clear how concrete, token activities by the composer bring about a practice (or historical individual) that -- if this is Rohrbaugh's idea -- exists as a new entity distinct from the embodiments in which it may be present. Nevertheless, Rohrbaugh's suggestion and Magnus's species analogy are the most promising realist proposals about repeatable types that I now know. It will be interesting to see whether they can be made to work.

If one rejects outright nominalism (without some worked-out theory in the background to explain our talk about and quantification over repeatable works), the various forms of musical materialism, Thomasson's abstract-artifacts approach, and Davies' token-action view, then the viable alternatives to Rohrbaugh's kind of account seem restricted to some form of eliminativism or fictionalism. Cameron's overall eliminativism about repeatable works has been effectively criticized by Rohrbaugh in this volume, and by Stecker and Stefano Predelli earlier. I'd add that either Cameron has repeatable works doing something like supervening on his fundamental ontological entities (and then he has genuinely existent, even if not ontologically fundamental, repeatable works), or else he owes us an account of exactly how and why his ultimate truthmakers become truthmakers for just these sentences about repeatable works and why we are led to accept and operate our picture of repeatable works using just these sentences. (My guess is that he will then turn into some sort of fictionalist.) His answer to Everett in the present volume does not suffer from these doubts, but it requires a profligate ontology that multiplies fictional objects and fictional works (in Frick-Frack cases, we wind up with two co-located stories and at least two sets of determinate Frick-Frack fictional objects in the actual world). I also don't think that the relevant names' references can always be plausibly claimed to be indeterminate in the way that Cameron suggests.[5]

Kania offers a thoughtful account of why fictionalism about repeatable works is right (although it is hermeneutic and not revolutionary fictionalism that is pointed to by Moore's plausible suggestion that our actual talk about repeatable works is underlain by a tacit assumption or pretense that such works exist). But, like Cameron and outright nominalists, Kania doesn't provide any details of how the fiction here is to work. From a different direction, Kleinschmidt and Ross have made a significant contribution to work on generics (although I'm not convinced by their criticisms of Predelli 2011, for example). It isn't clear, however, that their conclusions carry over to sentences about repeatable artworks, say Beethoven's Fifth Symphony, in a way that supports the eliminability of these works. We certainly get generic claims such as "the polar bear has / a polar bear has / polar bears have four paws," as well as claims, read non-generically, that quantify over individual polar bears ("every / each polar bear has four paws," etc.). The same happens with sentences about artifact-types ("the Adirondack chair has / an Adirondack chair has / Adirondack chairs have four legs" and "every / each Adirondack chair has four legs"). But, besides "The Fifth Symphony has four movements," we don't also find "a Fifth Symphony has / Fifth Symphonies have four movements" (on the relevant reading of these sentences), let alone sentences quantifying over individual Beethoven Fifth Symphonies (whatever such might be) such as "every / each Fifth Symphony has four movements." The term "the Fifth Symphony" here seems to be functioning firmly as a singular term in a way that doesn't allow for these latter sentences. And if it's a genuine singular term, then, barring fictionalist or other moves, we seem to be dealing with a genuine entity to which it refers.

Finally, Moore makes fascinating points about the possible indeterminacies in our application of the concept of a repeatable work. But in the end, and as I've noted, he posits two distinct, actually existent works for each unitary repeatable work that we now recognize (his structural and provenancial works). I don't see evidence, in our practice, that we always or even usually recognize such works, however, and it isn't clear how Moore can fit modal flexibility plausibly into his account. Moreover, and as he remarks in a footnote, as a result of his positing these distinct works, his supervaluationalism makes the sentence "musical works are individuatively determinate" come out true, even though this sentence seems to express the very claim he's arguing against (304n31). He suggests a metalinguistic reply to this problem and sees his view as a kind of realism about musical works. But I suspect that he would do better to abandon his structural and provenancial works and to embrace fully the (hermeneutic) fictionalism suggested by his idea that our usual talk of musical works involves the tacit semantic presupposition that such works exist and answer cleanly to our talk about and counting of them. Doing so would require him, like Kania, to work out the details of the relevant fictionalism. But if fictionalism is really the best way to develop Moore's views, then this point reinforces my conclusion that the essays in this fine volume leave us with two main options for understanding repeatable works: as being some sort of Rohrbaugh-style historical individuals or as being creatures of metaphysical pretense.

However the disputes about repeatable works are ultimately resolved, these essays should be read by everyone with an interest in these topics. Mag Uidhir has put together a stimulating collection of papers, and he deserves our thanks for doing so.


Everett, Anthony. 2005. "Against Fictional Realism," Journal of Philosophy 102, 624-49.

Howell, Robert. 2011. "Fictional Realism and Its Discontents," in Franck Lihoreau, ed., Truth in Fiction. Munich: Ontos Verlag, 153-202.

Predelli, Stefano. 2011. "Talk about Music: From Wolterstorffian Ambiguity to Generics," The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 69, 273-83.

Wetzel, Linda. 2009. Types and Tokens. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

[1] In their earlier work, Levinson and Rohrbaugh both note the relevance of species to questions about repeatable artworks. But Magnus is the first person to bring detailed biological theory to bear here.

[2] A quick comment on Cook: at least given his family-resemblance view of art, these conclusions seem right. But the family-resemblance case of open-endedness, deriving from the need for decisions about how far novel examples resemble established artworks, seems very different, in its details, from the open-endedness present in the Gödel case of arithmetic truths on which Cook eventually focuses. Cook’s discussion of the parallels between the cases is instructive, however.

[3] Moreover, Quine himself later abandoned the 1947 Goodman-Quine nominalism that Rossberg unhesitatingly endorses. Was Quine wrong? Why?

[4] Hazlett’s Yablo-inspired argument that all abstract objects (but not repeatable works) must have all their intrinsic properties essentially also appears flawed. A crucial step requires showing that an impure abstract object, say the set {Eiffel Tower}, “makes no demands of its own on the world” (167). But what Hazlett actually claims is that this impure set makes no additional demands on the world beyond that made by the Eiffel Tower itself. A demand is a demand, even if it isn’t an additional one. Moreover, if, as Hazlett seems to suppose, the Eiffel Tower itself ‘demands’ simply its own existence, then by parity of reasoning {Eiffel Tower} should demand its own existence -- namely, the existence of that singleton set, which is an entity distinct from, and additional to, the Eiffel Tower. And Hazlett cannot now write off the existence of that set as insignificant without begging the question in favor of nominalism. In addition, and to switch to a simpler example, if having a spherical shape is now intrinsic to lump of clay L, then it appears that having a member that has a spherical shape is intrinsic to {L}. But that latter property isn’t essential to {L} -- {L} remains the set that it is, with L as its member, even if L’s shape (and so {L}’s having that latter property) changes.

[5] A comment by Ben Caplan drew my attention to the profligacy point. See also my defense, in Howell (2011), of Everett’s line on fictionally indeterminate identities.