Art and Authority: Moral Rights and Meaning in Contemporary Visual Art

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K. E. Gover, Art and Authority: Moral Rights and Meaning in Contemporary Visual Art, Oxford University Press, 2018, 224 pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198768692.

Reviewed by Iskra Fileva, University of Colorado, Boulder


We sometimes say or do things that we do not endorse upon reflection: "I was having a bad day and lost my temper", or, "I was too tired to think clearly." The importance of this point is widely recognized in ethics, though what precisely we should make of it is a matter of ongoing debate. Can we hold people accountable for deeds they renounce or do not identify with? And if a person feels alienated from an action, can we nonetheless identify her with that action?

Interestingly, there has been little or no discussion of the importance of second-order endorsement in the process of art-making. Much as we may say or do things that we perceive as not expressive of who we are or of what we really think, artists sometimes create works they refuse to ratify and endorse as their own. K. E. Gover's account of art authorship is an elaboration of this idea. She dubs the account "the dual-intention theory." On this theory, the artistic process has two distinct moments: a generative one and an evaluative one. Since each of the two aspects of art making is intentional, Gover speaks of "dual" intention. The generative moment has to do with the creation of a work of art. The artist makes an artwork intentionally, using various techniques, for instance, pouring paint in a particular way. But then she steps back and takes a second look. Is the work good enough to attach one's name to? The answer to this question may be "no." An artist's studio typically houses some rejected paintings. In some sense, those works are authored by the artists who made them. They are intentionally produced by their creators. But there isn't full authorship in this case. Gover says of rejected works (taking here painter Helen Frankenthaler as an example):

They issued from her hand, yes, but she does not endorse them as works worthy of her name and reputation. She perhaps views these rejects as an inevitable byproduct of the creative process. And yet these rejected paintings are not unintentional products of her artistic activity in the same way as drill-bit shavings or breadcrumbs from one's morning toast are the unintentional results of one's carpentry or breakfasting. (32).

The dual-intention theory is meant to replace two extant accounts of authorship: what Gover dubs the "emotivist" and the "responsibility" views. The emotivist theory has been defended most prominently by legal scholars who discuss the moral rights of artists: the rights of artists over their works are greater in scope than those of anyone else over an object he or she makes. If you buy a chair from a carpenter, you can do with it as you please: you can draw pictures of baboons on it, leave it out in the rain, or use it as firewood. Not so with artworks, or at least visual artworks of "recognized stature": you may own a painting -- the material object -- but that does not give you a right to dispose of it in any way you please. The Visual Artists Rights Act (VARA) protects visual art from mutilation and destruction. Why should there be such a protection? What is the difference between a painting and a chair? The emotivist view postulates a quasi-spiritual connection between author and work. It says that an artwork is an "extension" of the artist. That it provides the public with a window into the artist's psyche, so to speak. Hence, harm to the work is harm to its author.

According to Gover this view fails for several reasons, the most important being that an artwork need not be an outward expression of the artist's inner self and that self's emotional complexity. After all, art-making can be motivated in a wide variety of ways -- by a desire for fame, by a desire for money, and so on. It need not be that the artist pours his or her soul into the work.

There is a second account of authorship. Gover dubs it the "responsibility account," though for reasons I will explain shortly, I think "effective intention" view would be a more accurate label. Whatever we call it, this second theory has been defended by philosophers in the context of discussing the nature of authorship rather than the legal rights of artists. The idea behind this theory has to do with a successful fulfillment of an intention to create an artwork. Since the artist is the source of the intentions that lead to the production of an artwork, the artist is responsible for the work.

This account is not so much misguided, on Gover's view, as it is incomplete. It correctly recognizes the importance of an artist's intention, but it overlooks the second moment of creation: reflective endorsement. It therefore cannot help us distinguish between works ratified by the artist and those rejected by her. Gover's dual-intention theory is meant to remedy this perceived defect in the responsibility account.

Having sketched the dual-intention theory, Gover goes on to discuss two questions that can help throw into relief the importance of endorsement to art-creation: the question of when a work is finished, and the question of the rights of artists over unendorsed works. On the first point, she suggests that all works of art are only ever provisionally finished. This is because completion is a relational property, meaning, a work is only complete in relation to an artist's belief that it is and disposition to treat it as finished. These attitudes, however, can change: an artist may come to regard a work he or she previously saw as finished as unfinished. (I am reminded of Marcel Proust, who is said to have made many late changes to volumes of his work that he initially regarded as complete.) What about rights over unendorsed works?

The focus of the discussion here is on an interesting controversy that received a lot of attention in the art world and was previously discussed by Gover: the Christoph Büchel v. Mass MoCA case. Büchel had an agreement with the Massachusetts Museum of Contemporary Art to work on a large-scale installation project, "Training Ground for Democracy." The agreement was open-ended, on both Büchel's and the museum's part. Collaboration began. Several months and hundreds of thousands of dollars later, the museum ran out of money. The artist was unhappy with the product and did not wish it to be shown to the public. The museum, however, wanted to show the unfinished installation, as it wanted something in exchange for its time and money. A legal battle ensued, the outcome of which is not public knowledge, because the parties settled. Gover, reasonably in my view, makes a moderate case for the museum side. She suggests that artistic freedom -- while it does, indeed, give an author the authority to reject a work and refuse to have his or her name associated with that work -- does not entail the freedom to use someone else's resources without providing something in return.

Gover goes on to discuss the relevance of an artist's public declarations to an adequate understanding of a work's features. Say an artist declares a work to be "site-specific": bound up with a particular location so that moving it would be tantamount to destroying it. Since artworks are protected from destruction under the law, they would, on this view, be protected from re-location, even when residents in the work's vicinity want the work removed. In Gover's view, such authorial pronouncements are of limited importance. While an artist has the authority to determine which of the features of a work will become aspects of the finished product, he or she has no authority to declare how a work is to be viewed. In other words, an artist determines what is to be interpreted but not how it is to be interpreted: artists may well fail to make their works site-specific simply by issuing verbal declarations. What they can do is make changes to the works themselves.

Gover then moves on to the fraught issue of appropriation art: appropriation artists put something like Gover's second moment of creation -- endorsement -- center stage. Except they do not endorse the works they themselves have created but rather, other artists' works. They may do modifications to the appropriated pieces -- as when appropriation artist Richard Prince took but modified photographer Patrick Cariou's pictures of Rastafarians. They might not make any modifications, as when artist Sherrie Levine photographed photographs originally taken by Walker Evans and exhibited them as her own works. Appropriation art raises difficult moral and legal questions, and as Gover points out, legal decisions regarding such art do not seem consistent. The line Gover herself takes here is moderately anti-appropriation: appropriated works are derivative -- they shine with a reflected light, as it were -- and must, therefore, be regarded as presumptively unfair.

In the concluding chapter, Gover takes the question of contemporary artists' challenges to ideals of authorship and of art itself. Some contemporary artists questioned the idea of the artist as a special person, with special skills, producing work far removed from daily life. Experimental composer John Cage, for instance, composed a piece, 4'33", that is not really a piece of music at all but rather silence meant, purportedly, to encourage listeners to focus on the background noise for four minutes and thirty-three seconds. The background noise is the piece, though all of us have heard background noise. Neo-conceptual artist Wim Delvoye, on the other hand, created a big contraption that he named "Cloaca." "Cloaca" symbolizes the human digestive tract: created with the help of experts in a variety of fields, it turns food into something resembling human excrement. We've all seen excrement too. Cloaca is the sort of work that not everyone would recognize as art. By extension, not everyone would recognize Delvoye as an artist, at least not for having made that work (his most famous one, by the way).

In Gover's view, however, avant-garde artists such as Cage and Delvoye have done little to alter our ideas of authorship and art. At the end of the day, gestures such as theirs serve a "largely rhetorical function" (9). For purportedly, avant-garde artists have sought to dethrone and demystify the author. But the effect achieved may be the opposite of that supposedly intended: "the ability of artists in the past century to transfigure anything into a work of art, be it a urinal, random noises, or even their own anxiety, serves to further mystify the artist's special powers of transformation, not to unmask them" (170).

Gover's is a light book. For the most part, it reads like a magazine article rather than an academic work. I appreciated the -- I believe intentional -- avoidance of unnecessary jargon. Questions are usually discussed in reference to real cases. The book is a collection of essays on interlocking themes rather than a big project that develops one main line of inquiry. (I for one don't mind that at all.) The central ideas are worth engaging with, and on the whole, I believe the book makes a valuable contribution to the literature. Does the account put forward succeed? I have a few observations to make.

First, I am not sure how Gover intends to respond to the interesting question that she herself raises in the beginning, about the difference between paintings and chairs. Why should paintings be protected from mutilation but not chairs? I note that the dual-intention theory cannot provide an answer. Dual intentions in the relevant sense are likely at work no less when a carpenter makes a chair than they are when a painter works on a painting. Indeed, dual intentions are ordinarily present when we do anything that we have a chance to correct or renounce. (They do not disappear without this opportunity, it is just that that second moment gets reduced to passive joy or regret, as in the phenomenon of "esprit de l'escalier" -- the better retorts that occur to us too late to be used.)

The emotivist view has an answer: there is a special and intimate bond between artist and artwork such that harming the work constitutes harm to the author. This view faces problems, as Gover notes, but what theory has a better response?

Second, I doubt that the distinction Gover draws between the author's power to determine the features of a work, on the one hand, and the power to give an authoritative interpretation on the other, can be drawn in just the way Gover wants. Consider site-specificity. Gover, remember, denies artists the authority to declare works site-specific. Why? The reason she gives is that the author has no authority to determine how a work is to be interpreted. But verbal pronouncements about the work -- such as declaring it to be site-specific -- are an attempt to provide an authoritative interpretation (rather than fix the work itself, by changing its features). I am not sure this argument works. After all, if the author can decide unilaterally what is to be interpreted, and the author says the "work-in-a-certain-site" is the thing to interpret, what licenses us to contradict the author? The answer appears -- to me, at least -- to be that there are limits on the author's power to determine which features are part of her work. This is immediately apparent if we imagine that the site is another artist's artwork, a point acknowledged by Gover: if I put a drawing of mine on top of a Rothko painting, I cannot declare the composite to be my artwork, even if the red color of the Rothko enhances the aesthetic qualities of my own drawing. The same, I suggest, can be said about sites such as non-art artifacts or nature. Say an artist positions a painting on a beach so that the ocean provides a background for it, and he declares that the ocean is part of the work. If that happens, it would not follow that no one can remove the painting from the beach on pain of an art mutilation charge. This is explained by the fact that the painter did not make the beach and the ocean. If the artist made the background, things would be different (and if he did not make the background but owns it, things may be different still). It is also true, as Gover suggests, that artists are not in a position to give authoritative interpretations of their own works, but that, I think, is a separate issue. That is not what explains the limits on the artist's power to declare a work site-specific.

Third, artists sometimes leave unendorsed works that the art community endorses and makes public after the author's death. How are we to explain this while respecting Gover's version of the dual-intention theory of authorship? Gover touches upon this point and suggests that artists may simply be mistaken about the value of their works: "Artists do not always know when their own works are finished, or whether they have aesthetic value. Kafka and Virgil, whose instructions to destroy their manuscripts after their deaths were ignored, are classic examples of this" (105). Two points are of note here: first, the ultimate endorsement that determines -- and appropriately so -- the fate of a work may be that of the community, not of the artist. Second, we typically regard works unendorsed by their now-deceased authors as fully authored by them. We may not regard an unfinished draft that's obviously in progress as fully authored in the relevant sense, but where we judge the work to be mature and on a par with the artist's other works, we attribute that work to the author in the fullest sense of the word. In doing so, we skirt the second moment of creation, or rather, we substitute our endorsement for the author's.

My last point concerns the importance of the generative moment of art. Gover downplays that somewhat, perhaps out of a desire to distance herself clearly from the Romantic view of the artist as a muse-inspired madman or woman. I think that it is ultimately the generative moment that sets artists apart from non-artists. Many can edit and approve of a good first draft. Few can generate one. Indeed, what Gover says about appropriation art leads me to think that she should accept this point. For she says, remember, that appropriation art is presumptively unfair. Why? Because it is derivative. You can't just endorse other people's work and thereby make it yours. When this point is followed to its logical conclusion, it will be seen that the generative moment is the key. An artist can create a great work and leave it unratified. If the work is valuable, the community will do the endorsement part. But endorsement without creation -- as in appropriation art cases -- can easily incur an unfair use charge.

Incidentally, in an essay called "A Chapter on Dreams," writer Robert Louis Stevenson discusses the creative process. He suggests that most of the work on a story or a novel is done by the unconscious, which he refers to, endearingly, as "Little People" and "Brownies." The conscious self's contribution -- though it edits, alters, accepts, and rejects ideas that come from the "Little People" -- is relatively minor. Generation is the task that requires more talent. Stevenson writes:

For myself -- what I call I, my conscious ego, the denizen of the pineal gland unless he has changed his residence since Descartes, the man with the conscience and the variable bank-account, the man with the hat and the boots, and the privilege of voting and not carrying his candidate at the general elections -- I am sometimes tempted to suppose he is no story-teller at all, but a creature as matter of fact as any cheesemonger or any cheese, and a realist bemired up to the ears in actuality; so that, by that account, the whole of my published fiction should be the single-handed product of some Brownie, some Familiar, some unseen collaborator, whom I keep locked in a back garret, while I get all the praise and he but a share (which I cannot prevent him getting) of the pudding. I am an excellent adviser, something like Moliere's servant; I pull back and I cut down; and I dress the whole in the best words and sentences that I can find and make; I hold the pen, too; and I do the sitting at the table, which is about the worst of it; and when all is done, I make up the manuscript and pay for the registration; so that, on the whole, I have some claim to share, though not so largely as I do, in the profits of our common enterprise.[2]

This description may apply to a work to a greater or lesser extent, of course, but I imagine it is true of much of what we consider powerful and moving art. Most of us can recognize such art when we see it, and had we generated it, we would probably have endorsed it also. But we did not generate it. I am reminded of something Leonard Cohen said in an interview once: "I don't know where the good songs come from. If I did, I'd go there more often."

[1] K. E. Gover. (2012). "Christoph Büchel v. Mass MoCA: A Tilted Arc for the Twenty-First Century." The Journal of Aesthetic Education 46, no. 1: 46-58. 

[2] Robert Louis Stevenson. 1888. "A Chapter on Dreams." Scribner's Magazine 3: 127.