Art and Belief

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Ema Sullivan-Bissett, Helen Bradley, and Paul Noordhof (eds.), Art and Belief, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198805403.

Reviewed by Nils-Hennes Stear, University of Southampton


The book has four sections. The first tackles testimony in literary fictions -- under which circumstances, if any, their authors can give it (with papers by Kathleen Stock, Eva-Maria Konrad, and co-authors Anna Ichino and Gregory Currie). The second addresses literary fiction's capacity to furnish 'humanist knowledge' -- deep insights into the psyche and human condition (James O. Young, Peter Lamarque, Allan Hazlett, and Lucy O'Brien). Section three looks at two different questions: (a) whether the empirically demonstrated carelessness with which readers form beliefs from fictional texts undoes truth-tied accounts of belief (co-authors Ema Sullivan-Bissett and Lisa Bortolotti, and Asbjørn Steglich-Petersen); and (b) whether attitudes towards fictions are genuine rather than, say, merely pretend (co-authors Wesley Buckwalter and Katherine Tullmann). The final section encompasses two papers detailing the consequences of various commitments concerning aesthetic testimony (Jon Robson and Daniel Whiting).

Of these, section three hangs together the least, as indicated by its somewhat ragbag title: 'Belief, Truth, and Attitudes from Fictional Persuasion'. Its first two chapters directly address one another, while the third stands a little isolated. Cohesion is also a minor difficulty for the book as a whole. Except for the last two chapters, the book is more accurately about fiction (rather than art) and belief, and literary fiction at that. So the volume can feel unified in something like the way a county fair's 'animal corner' would by placing a petting zoo beside a dog fighting ring. In other respects, however, the book's various chapters are tied together nicely with frequent and helpful references among chapters. It's also worth remembering that unity can be fetishized in anthologies, and the papers don't suffer from whatever unity the book lacks.

In fact, at times there's a surfeit of unity when the book duplicates background material. Sullivan-Bissett and Bortolotti (pp. 154-157), for instance, summarize much of the same empirical work Ichino and Currie do (pp. 66-67), a summary repeated again by Steglich-Petersen (pp. 175-177). Some of this can't be helped, of course, and poses no issue to readers studying one or two articles, rather than the whole book as, heroically, reviewers must.

Some editorial decisions deserve mention. Concerning contributors, the gender balance is a commendably unusual 50/50; there's a healthy mix of old coin with more recently minted PhDs; and, refreshingly, every fourth paper is jointly authored. The contributors are also drawn from beyond the Anglophone nations, hopeful evidence of growing transnational exchange in a discipline long geographically siloed. Other demographic facts are harder to surmise, though the contributors appear to be uniformly White, or nearly so, depending on one's preferred categorization system.

Concerning formatting, some anthologies opt for endnotes over footnotes, a decision as sensible as serving the ketchup 30 feet from the French fries. Some even heap all the references at the very end like cold, congealed left-overs after a filling meal. Graciously, this one does neither. The editors have included synopses of each chapter and a visual map of the various positions defended in the Introduction -- research aids that bear emulating. Finally, the papers are all admirably short. Excluding references, the average paper is a mere 16 standard-issue hardback pages long. The longest, by Stock, comes in at 21 pages.

Stock opens the volume, arguing that fiction can be a 'relatively solid source of information' (p. 20) conferring knowledge via author testimony. Stock's arguments persuasively confront skepticism about this claim rooted in empirical and more traditionally philosophical work.

One minor shortcoming is a ground-clearing response Stock offers to the claim that literary fictions can't convey testimony because authors cannot adequately intend to impart belief through them. Stock wishes to vindicate the indignation appreciators feel towards misleading or inaccurate fictions. By showing that fictions can provide testimony, she would show that such anger is sometimes justified, just as anger at someone who lies is. Stock retorts that authors can have the right testimonial intentions, citing as evidence the indignation we feel when authors mislead (pp. 22-23). But in doing so, Stock appears to use the fact of our indignation ultimately to vindicate it.

Reading the second paper by Konrad is akin to watching someone build a miniature cathedral, the systematic construction embellished with ornate notation. Konrad defends 'compositionalism' -- the view that fictional texts can contain factual discourse. While her preferred theory is worked out meticulously, I suspect a much simpler argument would do; namely, one can make assertions using (in principle) any characteristically non-assertoric medium; thus, one can do so by writing text in works of fiction. If stipulative conventions are allowed I could, say, assert that Donald Trump is a lascivious buffoon by ending a conditional sentence with a semi-colon; if not, I can still assert indefinitely many things by clearing my throat, slamming a door, leaving a bouquet upturned in the garbage, etc. Why should writing words be any different? Or, reversing things, one can make propositions fictional (in principle) by doing anything: sculpting a unicorn, stipulating 'puddles are lava', snogging a portrait, etc. Why couldn't one do so by asserting something? Indeed, this is more or less where Konrad ends up, arguing that a single speech act can perform multiple illocutionary acts -- i.e. a passage can simultaneously be both fictive and assertive discourse (p. 57).

Konrad admirably tries to avoid the traps encumbering linguistic theories of fictionality. She concludes that fictional discourse must be understood as a sui generis illocutionary act prescribing imaginings, rather than a pretended illocutionary act à la Searle (pp. 57-58). But the linguistic traps have sharp teeth; on Konrad's account, honouring a fiction's prescriptions involves imagining someone 'telling the whole narrative as a real story' (p. 55), which, much like David Lewis' influential view, thereby makes effaced narrators impossible. This consequence looks especially costly once one considers non-literary fictions, such as representational painting, where requiring that one recognize a fictional shower akin to a narrator is implausible.

Ichino and Currie's paper is among the more discursive, expressing less an explicit thesis than a general skepticism about fictional works' capacity to improve readers epistemically, especially concerning controversial or evaluative claims that the humanistic tradition emphasizes.

In one interesting section, Ichino and Currie try to understand how these humanistic claims differ from straightforward empirical ones. Evaluative claims, they write, are more naturally seen as expressed by their authors than empirical claims, rather than being merely expressive of their beliefs. A storyteller, they claim, will more likely conform a story to local geography automatically, whereas conforming to a personal vision of, for instance, love will likely be conscious (pp. 75-76). The claim is important because whether an author deliberately expresses a belief has implications for whether she provides testimony.

However, this discussion left me unconvinced. True, personal views may stand out from impersonal ones in the way described; but this seems as true of personal takes on merely empirical matters as of evaluative ones. Consider, for instance, Michael Crichton's State of Fear, which dramatizes the author's anthropogenic climate change denial. Similarly, many evaluative attitudes are impersonal, and thus not deliberately expressed, since they're just 'in the air'. Consider the default hostility to Iran in US corporate journalism, or the consistently racialized villains in animated Disney features, for instance.

While section two's papers are all thoughtful and well-written, they bring to the surface a question flowing quietly beneath the volume's first half and work on literature's cognitive benefits generally: what exactly is the aesthetic cognitivism debate about? For instance, what is the (contested) epistemic benefit's nature: True belief? Truer belief? Knowledge? What level of benefit does literature (fail to) meet: That it can benefit us? Does so more often than not? Does so more than leading brands of inquiry? Does so in medium-unique ways? What is the supposed benefit's scope: All belief kinds? Just empirical ones? Just 'humanistic' ones? Which works (fail to) provide the benefit: High art novels? Popular fiction? Both? Clarifying these questions is important for two reasons relevant here. First, while I sense that the chapters mean to offer rival views on aesthetic cognitivism, many seem compatible. Second, it's sometimes unclear what, and how interestingly controversial, the claim an author takes herself to have established really is.

To illustrate: Young's paper defends aesthetic cognitivism; it argues, roughly, that fiction can provide readers with epistemic benefits by (1) undermining stereotypes; (2) triggering memories that are evidence for true beliefs; and (3) engaging cognitively valuable emotions. Young addresses his paper to the 'niggling doubt' that 'perhaps the beliefs acquired from literary fiction' (used here as an honorific) 'and other artworks are not true' (p. 98). If the doubt is whether artworks can provide true beliefs, then Young successfully shows various interesting mechanisms by which they do. But that literature sometimes provides true beliefs strikes me as pretty obvious. So perhaps the doubt really concerns whether literature is well-suited to providing them.

The problem, however, is that every mechanism Young cites could support an argument against aesthetic cognitivism: reinforcing stereotypes, distorting memories, and engaging cognitively vicious emotions. Consider, for instance, the claim that readers of literary fiction are better at empathic mind-reading exercises than readers of popular fiction. Supposing that's true, it follows that readers of popular fiction are worse at doing these things than readers of literary fiction. Putting aside less interesting interpretations of this data, what matters, I suppose, isn't how each set of readers compares to the other, but to how they compare to some non-reading baseline. Or consider the claim that reading literary fiction is quite good, epistemically, at providing the particularity of first-person perspectives as evidence, rather than aperspectival descriptions typical of other kinds of text. As Young acknowledges, this technique could just as well warp as sharpen a reader's cognitive tools. Young responds that no method of belief acquisition is perfect and that available evidence suggests this literary method is quite reliable (p. 90-92). But, again, the evidence he invokes shows only that literary fictions can help in this way, not that they do most or all of the time.

I don't mean to pick on Young; these unclarities affect most of the authors in the book's first half to some extent. And there's a worry that sometimes a paper purporting to establish a very sexy claim argues only for a much plainer cousin. Though, perhaps that's just philosophy. (One notable exception is O'Brien's paper, which offers a very qualified conclusion, sensitive to the worries I've raised).

Section three's first two papers present a challenge to truth-tied accounts of belief by Sullivan-Bissett and Bortolotti and a kind of critical response by Steglich-Petersen, albeit with more collaborative back-and-forth than usual. In the interest of space, I'll remark only that Steglich-Petersen's response (pp. 189-190) seems convincing.

The third paper by Buckwalter and Tullmann argues for the 'Genuine-Attitude View' (GAV), according to which our 'cognitive responses to fictions are genuine beliefs closely resembling those that we typically form in real life' (p. 194). The opposing 'Distinct-Attitude View' (DAV), is purportedly motivated by combining two claims:

  1. Our cognitive reactions to fictions lead to different behaviours than our cognitive reactions to non-fictions;
  2. What makes something a belief are distinctive inputs and behavioural outputs (functionalism). (p. 195)

Buckwalter and Tullmann deny that (1) and (2) motivate DAV through several arguments. There's a lot to say about this paper, but I'll restrict myself to one observation.

The authors argue that what might better explain the different behaviours towards fictions isn't a difference in cognitive attitude, but a difference in intentional content: 'When I say 'I believe that Demetrius treated Helena very poorly', for example, I mean 'I believe that Demetrius treated Helena very poorly [in the fiction]' . . . The same may hold for our mental attitudes' (p. 196). The idea is that the believed proposition contains a fictional operator.

A difficulty here concerns the fictional operator's position. Suppose it has narrow scope, such that the structure of the utterance above would be S believes that, fictionally, Demetrius treated Helena poorly. Undoubtedly, we can have beliefs of this kind -- about what is true according to a story -- much as I can have beliefs about what is true according to Donald Trump's beliefs. But if intended to explain the kinds of attitudes central to engaging with fictions, rather than merely critically discussing them, these aren't enough. Many of our attitudes to fictions we fully engage with have an unmistakable de re quality; if I must believe anything to fully engage, it's that Demetrius treated Helena poorly, not merely that according to a story he did so. The obvious way to capture this intentional immediacy is to give the fictionality operator wide scope: Fictionally, I believe Demetrius treated Helena poorly, which is just to say that Demetrius, Helena, and I are embedded in the same fiction -- a game of make-believe I play with A Midsummer Night's Dream, as one influential theory has it. But the wide-scope reading can't be Buckwalter and Tullmann's, since it involves no actual belief, merely a fictional one.

The volume's final section consists of two delicately worked out discussions of aesthetic testimony. Robson argues that two widely held claims about such testimony are in fact incompatible; Whiting advances a potential explanation for why bare aesthetic testimony (testimony that x is aesthetically good or bad, merely) doesn't convey knowledge.

Robson's paper is insightful, if a little drawn-out. The central idea, more or less captured in section five, is that if aesthetic judgements are subject to different norms, aims, or functions than ordinary judgements and beliefs have constitutive norms, aims, or functions, then aesthetic judgements can't be beliefs. Thus, aesthetic testimony pessimists thinking aesthetic judgements are beliefs subject to extra norms, for instance, hold inconsistent commitments. Since I have little to say about Robson's paper, I'll conclude with Whiting's.

Whiting's paper exploits four independently motivated claims. Together, these claims entail that a bare belief that something is aesthetically good (or bad), unsupplemented by supporting beliefs about how it is good, is irrational. Thus, knowledge from bare aesthetic testimony is impossible. In the interest of space, I'll simplify the careful argument and won't motivate the claims it depends upon.

Whiting takes reasons to be facts that favour an attitude (or act -- ignore this), and takes an attitude to be (pro tanto -- ignore this) rational if and only if it is a priori that were what one believes true, it would be a reason (of the right kind -- ignore this) to hold the attitude. This is combined with the claim that something's mere aesthetic goodness is no reason to admire it. Thus, since artwork A's mere aesthetic goodness isn't a reason to admire A, believing A is aesthetically good doesn't make admiring A rational. Whiting then uses this to perform modus tollens on the claim that if it's rational to believe there's a reason to hold an attitude, then it's rational to hold that attitude. Thus, since admiring A isn't rational, neither is believing that there's a reason to admire A. Finally, Whiting uses this to perform a final modus tollens on the claim that if it's rational to believe something is aesthetically good, then it's rational to believe there's a reason to admire it (i.e. whatever features make it aesthetically good). Since it isn't rational to believe there's a reason to admire A, then it isn't rational to believe that A is aesthetically good.

A first observation is that one can run an isomorphic pessimistic argument against bare moral testimony. Whether this is a bullet to bite or a delicious bullet-shaped treat to savour will depend on one's views about moral testimony.

Second, and more importantly, the argument gets going because something's mere aesthetic goodness is no reason to admire it. However, in the spirit of the final claim Whiting deploys, it seems that one who believes A is good could derive a priori that there's some respect in which it is good -- some feature or other that makes it good. If so, then by believing that A is good, she would believe A has some admirable quality and thereby have a reason, of a non-specific sort, to admire A. This would then block the inferences that result in the pessimistic conclusion.

Whiting could of course reply that something so non-specific couldn't function as a reason. To paraphrase something he says on a distinct theme, such a person wouldn't be 'sensitive to or in a position to appreciate its reason-giving force' (p. 234). But suppose instead of vaguely characterizing the reason as 'something-or-other', the believer conceptualizes it as a disjunction of aesthetically good-making features. That is, she infers that being aesthetically good entails being beautiful, sublime, or witty, etc. It's less clear now that she has no reason to admire A. Disjunctions might seem like weird reasons. But suppose you glimpse just enough of a sculpture to recognize only that it is either by Edmonia Lewis or Harriet Hosmer, but you're unsure which. It seems perfectly rational to admire it nonetheless, despite your disjunctive reason(s). Perhaps not everyone can reason from mere aesthetic goodness to this kind of disjunction and so the inference isn't universally a priori. Fair enough, though this drastically restricts the pessimism's scope.

All considered, this is an excellently edited collection of consistently high-quality papers that should interest epistemologists, fiction theorists, and philosophers of art and literature.