Art and Ethical Criticism

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Garry L. Hagberg (ed.), Art and Ethical Criticism, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 292pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405134835.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Over the past twenty or so years, both the philosophy of art and literary and art studies have progressively returned, albeit somewhat fitfully, to considering human subjects and the powers and interests they bring to the construction and reception of art. In the philosophy of art, Stanley Cavell and Arthur Danto called attention to the expressive and revelatory powers of art, helping us to overcome flatter institutional theories of art and one-sided obsession with the epistemological problem of the justification of judgments of taste. In literary studies, the New Critical formalism that reigned up through the mid-1960s was displaced first by deconstruction and then by various forms of sociohistorical analysis. Though much interesting and valuable work was done, a feeling began to emerge that this latter analysis scanted too much both the powers of authors to think productively and critically about their social circumstances and the powers of their audiences to follow their densely specific lines of thought. These two lines of disciplinary development have now begun to converge under the heading of ethical criticism: "criticism" because the philosophical thoughts about the powers and interest of literary art are often urged substantially via engagement with particular works, and "ethical" because it is oriented toward human subjects and what they might learn about values rather than toward generalizing sociohistorical explanation. A list of central figures in this line of development would include not only Cavell and Danto, but also Martha Nussbaum, Frank Farrell, Noël Carroll, John Gibson, and the present reviewer in philosophy, Wayne Booth, Charles Altieri, and Frank Kermode in literary studies and James Elkins and Michael Fried (all along) in the visual arts. In each case, the effort is to accept and incorporate, rather than deny, the insights afforded by deconstruction and sociohistorical criticism (beyond formalism) while focusing nonetheless centrally on the powers and interest of art as itself a form of productive critical thought.

A related but narrower line of thinking within philosophy has focused specifically on the question of the relation between the artistic value of a work and the moral value of a work. Does the fact that a given work embodies a noxious moral attitude detract from its artistic value, and does a praiseworthy moral attitude in a work add to its artistic value? Or is artistic value centrally formal and aesthetic, so that embodied moral attitudes have no implications for artistic value? Within discussions of these questions, Leni Riefenstahl and the Marquis de Sade are often under consideration. Important work on this topic has been done by Berys Gaut, Matthew Kieran, Marcia Eaton, Richard Posner, and Noël Carroll, among others. Jerrold Levinson's collection Aesthetics and Ethics provides a valuable overview of the various positions as does my An Introduction to the Philosophy of Art, Chapter 9, "Art and Morality." A difficulty that has frequently been thought to attach to raising the topic of art and morality in just this way, however, is that it is not so clear how to distinguish the art-relevant features of a work sharply and exhaustively from its ethical features. Are Pynchon's manic wordplay or Powell's sympathetic reserve from overt judgment or Robbe-Grillet's geometric coolness artistic or moral features of their texts? Likewise for Francis Bacon's or David Hockney's ways of handling the painting of their human subjects. If it is hard to say with any assurance that these features are ethical rather than artistic (or vice versa), then it courts obtuseness to ask how the ethical affects the artistic.

Garry Hagberg's new anthology Art and Ethical Criticism consists of twelve new essays -- ten by philosophers, one each by an art historian and a professor of French -- together with a short foreword. The overall argument that emerges from these essays is that the first, broader topic (the powers and interest of art for human subjects) is more important than the second, narrower topic (the relation between artistic and moral value), and the essays are strongest exactly when they illuminate the powers and interest of art, precisely by not separating the artistic and ethical features of a work sharply from each other.

The Foreword announces that "ethical criticism" covers "the task of elucidating the ethical content of the arts, the character and viability of our ethical responses to them, and the nature of the moral benefit provided by a serious engagement with literature, the visual arts, and music" (xi). It is, then, pretty much taken for granted that art, or at least successful art, matters ethically -- matters, that is, to and for human subjects in thinking about values -- and the central task is then elucidating how this is so. The elucidations on offer are ranged under roughly five headings: historical foundations, general conceptions of ethical content, literature, the visual arts, and music.

In the sole essay in Part I, Paul Guyer surveys the philosophies of art of Hutcheson, Shaftesbury, Wolff, Baumgarten, Sulzer, Diderot, Kames, and Kant in order to establish that no major 18th century thinker held that art is of purely formal interest without ethical significance. Taking the ethical stance manifested in a work into account when evaluating it was a commonplace practice, with purer formalisms (e.g. Clive Bell) emerging only in the late 19th and early 20th centuries. All this is surely right, and it is useful to have this terrain surveyed, especially to undo over-simplifications of Kant as a formalist.

Part II on Ethical Content contains essays by Joshua Landy, Mitchell Green, and Noël Carroll. Landy reads Chaucer's "The Nun's Priest's Tale" as "a parody of didacticism" (68). What falls out of this reading is that literary fiction never teaches moral values. "Literature cannot edify, but it can clarify" (80). That is, it cannot teach us any moral doctrines, but it can help us to become clearer about values we already have. Training in how to see complexities, where many values are in play, is more in view than overt instruction. This is a promising line of thought, though the full moral psychology that would be necessary in order to elucidate the relevant clarification and training is not present.

Mitchell Green begins to address this lack by drawing on a theory of artistic expression that he has developed elsewhere. After surveying various senses of "showing," including giving evidence for, making perceptible, proving, demonstrating a skill, and expressing a mood, feeling, or affect, Green settles on the account that expressing, as a species of showing, "makes knowledge available" (97), though audience uptake on a showing is required in order for it to take effect. In the literary arts, what is shown is predominantly an affect or mood ("how an emotion, mood, or experience appears or … feels" [112]). (Here Green is close to work by Dorothy Walsh and Susan Feagin that he does not mention.) Such showings may further cultivate skill in empathizing. Missing in this rehearsal, however, are accounts of the moral significance of empathy and of why and how literature's formal devices are especially good at cultivating empathy where we need it. Just what sorts of things about the experiences of others are we prone not to feel, why does it matter to feel them, and how does literature help formally to cultivate apt feeling in morally significant ways?

Noël Carroll's essay, substantially the richest in Part II, addresses exactly these questions. Narratives, fictional and otherwise, Carroll argues (following Aristotle), are marked by their possession of selected detail. They thus combine particularity and generality, as details are selected for their significance, especially their significance in displaying attitudes and the affective coloration of an experience of a situation. The selection of details as attitudinally and affectively colored matters because of the natures of virtues and vices. Virtues and vices are i) temporally extended dispositions to act or respond, ii) that have 'insides' or affective dimensions, and iii) that are displayed differently in different circumstances (45). A narrative is then able to show the interplay of outside (what is done in a context) and inside (attitude and feeling) over time (46). By following a narrative, we may then achieve fuller orientation in the development of our own dispositions (virtuous, one hopes) that are suffused with feeling. We may see how, in this new setting, to go on more coherently in the expression of our attitudes and commitments. "The notion of a meaningful life," in which the sustained, coherent exercise of virtue is achieved, "is parasitic on the notion of a meaningful narrative" (57), for the relevant coherence just is essentially narratival. One might perhaps wish for a fuller, more historical account of exactly why we moderns are especially prone to forget the powers of narrative to present the universal (shared possibilities of life) in the particular, in favor of the presentations of more immediately sortal, measurement-related universals (mass, velocity, etc.) that are a central business of the natural sciences. This forgetting must have something to do both with the rise of modern science and with the development in modernity of (increasing awareness of) cultural diversity, so that we have, if anything, too many narratives on hand rather than too few, so that general revelatory power may be harder to discern. Given, however, Carroll's masterful constructive analysis of the powers of narrative, it would be churlish to complain much.

Part III on literature is focused on particular cases and, while advancing the overall argument, is somewhat slighter in weight than the overt theorizing of Part II on ethical content. Robert Solomon surveys the responses of the major characters of Camus's The Plague to the horrors of their situation, arguing unsurprisingly that "human responsibility emerges as its major theme" (165) and that responsibility is best exercised in "doing something, [in] making life meaningful, despite its futility or its consequences, and quite apart from any moral 'principles' that might be operative" (172). Paisley Livingston reads Virginia Woolf's 1920 short story "Solid Objects" as a reduction of Clive Bell's formalism, showing that it is an absurd characterization of aesthetic experience as a self-sufficient pleasure in pure form. "Rapture does not suffice" (138); there are "cognitive, … content, … and axiological conditions" (139) for the proper experience of art. Catherine Wilson balances the thoughts, drawn from Bernard Williams, that risk is unavoidable in life and that no value obviously has categorical force in all circumstances of personal life against the thought that we moderns tend to accept some form of (political?) equality as an absolute value. The task is then to develop so far as possible institutions of equal political citizenship without self-piety and the refusal to recognize contingency and complexity. J. M. Coetzee's novel Disgrace usefully tracks the complexities and difficulties of this task.

The treatment of visual works of art in Part IV provides a useful counterpoint to the treatment of literature in Part III, since there are at least in some cases ethical questions about how we are to treat them, quite apart from how they may instruct us. In addition, the different modality of experience involved in dwelling in visual experience rather than reading alone brings different ethical complexities and possibilities to the fore. The essays by Ivan Gaskell and David Davies focus less on what we might learn ethically from works than on questions about how we are to treat them and about their differences as art from non-art objects. Gaskell considers primarily the display of Native American baskets in museums. Though return of these objects to the descendents of their original makers and users is sometimes required, both morally and legally, that is not always and obviously the best course of action. Taking into account both moral and legal responsibilities, museum curators as members of the dominant culture must decide whether and, if so, how to display them. Since these objects are often sacred or at least have something numinous about them in 'speaking' of and for a whole way of life, it is a mistake to display them as "specimens alone" (239) of the Native American basket in general. They are, rather, specifically Chitimacha or Hupa, for example, with distinct origins, uses, and aesthetic and expressive features. For any such object, we should "accord it historical and aesthetic standing" (235), letting it count in our experience as museum visitors as the specifically valuable thing it is. Curators can and should further this kind of experience through appropriate lighting, arrangement, and commentary.

Davies turns to the photographs of Diane Arbus, framed by Susan Sontag's criticism of them, in order to illuminate the interest of photographic art. Sontag notoriously charged that Arbus's images exploit their subjects and function pornographically to titillate their viewers and to desensitize them to the grotesqueries of their subjects' appearances. How, Davies wonders, could a photograph even be charged with doing such things? -- Only if, contrary to Roger Scruton's reading of photographs as necessarily inartistic, merely causally engendered 'direct' transcriptions of their subjects, these images do embody thoughts about and attitudes toward their subjects. Since, however, the visually grotesque subjects are presented with striking directness as "confident and accepting of their lives" (225), and so presented, moreover, with their consent, the images are specifically not demeaning or horrible. In representing their subjects both as subjects and as subjects of thought, they are not pornographic, but rather successfully artistic. Here too, as with Landy and Green, one would like to hear more about how and why such artistic success matters ethically. It is clear that there is an achievement of art about which ethical questions have been raised (by Sontag) and settled (by Davies), but then how and why does this work really matter to viewers who do understand what is going on?

Carolyn Korsmeyer's essay, "Staying in Touch," is richer in dwelling more fully on what we have to learn from visual art. Beginning from considering the Gettysburg battlefield, Silesian House (Gestapo interrogation cells in Krakow, now part of its Historical Museum), and, especially, Frank Lloyd Wright's Darwin Martin House in Buffalo, New York, Korsmeyer argues that "genuineness is a feature that has both ethical and aesthetic valence" (188). It matters to us to know that this battlefield looks largely as it did in 1863, that it is just these walls on which prisoners scratched their names and prayers, and that restoration of this house used as many original elements as possible. Only a genuine article can "bear witness … to a way of life and to a distinctive artistic achievement" (206). We want to stay literally in touch with the object, placing our hands on it or walking over it, as itself an inscription of the experience that went into its making, and no replica will suffice for this. Here the aesthetic dimension ("the affective understanding that issues from imaginative engagement") and the ethical dimension ("the meaning [of a situation involving] suffering, cruelty, loss; or valor, endurance, or achievement") (190) are simply not separable from each other. This claim, compellingly presented through these examples, might well stand for the strongest line of thought in the collection as a whole. In the spirit of Dewey, it situates art objects and the making and apprehending of them within a wider field of human experiences and concerns, however formally distinctive they may also be.

In Part V, Stephen Davies and Garry Hagberg turn to music. Davies undertakes to explain why Guglielmo does not participate in the canon in the last act finale of Cosi Fan Tuttì. The answer is that Cosi is not (only) a simple, serial opera buffa, but (also) a large-scale dramatic musical form that Mozart deploys to show the development of individuals as they come "to appreciate their own virtues and vices" (254). The psychological journey toward this end is no simple matter, and Guglielmo's non-participation shows how "the inescapable autonomy of the individual [is set] against the common need for mutual acceptance and recognition" (255), in life as in art.

Garry Hagberg's extraordinarily rich concluding essay focuses on how jazz "improvisation simultaneously mimetically represents as well as exemplifies in action … ethical content" (259). What is both exemplified and represented (or presented by being consciously exemplified for attentive understanding of its significance in other domains) falls under the broad heading of "'ear training' in the realm of humane acknowledgment" (261). That is, jazz improvisers must display such things as "a mindfulness of the labors and projects of others" (261), awareness of "the anti-atomistic nature of intentional action itself" (261), "the distinctive kind of mindfulness that morally significant intentional action demands" (262), and acknowledgment of "the autonomy of others" (262) in mutually respectful musical dialogue. These claims are tellingly illustrated via specific references to Charlie Parker, Charles Mingus, Billie Holiday, Freddie Green, Bill Evans, and Lee Konitz, among others. I dare say that anyone who heard Lee Konitz play, as I have, and paid attention, was struck by the reflective clarity of his musical intelligence and responsiveness. Hagberg's account of Konitz's achievement, as of the achievements and failures of the other figures mentioned (e.g., Mingus) is right on the mark. Once one fully sees the nature of improvisatory intelligence that is simultaneously musical and ethical, then, Hagberg argues, it seems obvious that utilitarian and deontological theories of right action at a moment are desperately over-simplified, inattentive to what responsiveness, respect, the avoidance of cliché, and the projection of a future out of a remembered past really involve. (I note, as Hagberg does in accepting the value of respect, that a Kantian morality of principle rather than narrow rule-mongering is wholly compatible with this thought.) The idea that one improvises intelligently in the moment, drawing on a background of both training and talk, so that one is able after the fact to give a learned, retrospective justification of what one did by specifying a process of reasoning that one didn't just then, in the moment, explicitly go through, further undoes the Cartesian picture of an action as consisting of a bodily movement plus an (explicit, inner, guiding) intention. That picture, like the utilitarian and deontological accounts of right action, both oversimplifies and misdescribes our (sometimes intelligent) being in the world and with others.

That conclusions such as these in ethics, metaphysics, and the philosophy of mind, echoed in many of the other essays and compellingly achieved, arise out of the consideration of various practices of art ought to undermine the more abstractly generalizing, science-inspired forms of theorizing about human life that prominently distinguish central precincts of philosophy from the other disciplines of the humanities, arts, and history, thus turning philosophy toward more substantial affiliation with these latter fields, at least where values are concerned. Entrenched disciplinary habits being what they are, it is not likely that any significant shift along these lines will take place very soon. These essays provide, nonetheless, important reasons why it ought to.