Art and Institution: Aesthetics in the Late Works of Merleau-Ponty

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Rajiv Kaushik, Art and Institution: Aesthetics in the Late Works of Merleau-Ponty, Continuum, 2011, 163pp., ISBN 9781441136633.

Reviewed by Patrick Burke, Gonzaga in Florence


Like Friedrich Schelling before him, Maurice Merleau-Ponty wanted to think the excess of Being over the consciousness of Being. Like Schelling he found resources for this project already at work in art. In fact, from almost its beginning the formal philosophical thought of Merleau-Ponty intersected with the works of Paul Valery, Marcel Proust, and Paul Cezanne as if they could express what for transcendental phenomenology would always remain a closed secret or mystery. One of the members of his dissertation committee, Emile Bréhier, indicated that Merleau-Ponty's thought would be better expressed in literature and in painting than in philosophy. Rajiv Kaushik disagrees. In his magisterial work, Art and Institution, Rajiv Kaushik takes up with great rigor and insight the internal and dynamic relation of art to philosophy in Merleau-Ponty's mature thought. In this book he focuses principally on the notion of Urstiftung (originary institution) as it was developed by Merleau-Ponty from 1952, when he assumed the Chair of Philosophy at Collège de France, until the time of his death in 1961 when he was writing The Visible and the Invisible. Rajiv Kaushik relates this notion to the work of art in both its appearing and appearance, as both the event of creation and the created object. The pivotal and radical claim in this book is that Urstiftung is a pre-subjective and pre-objective process rendering possible and intelligible the subject-object relation and, as such, is prior to constituting consciousness and grounds phenomenological reflection as well as artistic production.

Because the notion of institution is intrinsically linked in Merleau-Ponty's thought with that of passivity, it is preferable, in my judgment, to read Kaushik's book as taking up the challenge delineated by Heidegger in his 1949 "Introduction" to What is Metaphysics? There he calls for a 'thinking from the outside' that is about the outside (Auseinander) of the opening of being itself. That Merleau-Ponty takes up this challenge is indicated in "Eye and Mind" where he writes that the philosopher must turn to the painter who alone practices in innocence the phenomenologist's epoché, who alone genuinely disengages the watchwords of knowledge and action and holds the world suspended. Painting is ecstatic life, and even those things most proper to the painter, the use of line and color and brush, seem to be called for by the things themselves that would command even the painter's look and eliciting within him or her, as Paul Klee reports, the feeling of being looked at by them. The painter, in being so moved, is engaged in a more fundamental way of thinking, beyond the immanence of consciousness, a thinking from the outside.

Throughout his book Rajiv Kaushik shows how art, not only painting but also literary art and music, discloses the power of phenomenality, the apparitional power instituting both its own appearance through the artist and the conceptless generation and generativity of both the artist and things. The work of art is thus, for Kaushik, the exemplar of this dynamic and creative process of institution. In Merleau-Ponty's words it is a "matrix event." I.e., in its most originary form it is an acquisition that makes possible the future of other acquisitions that in a sense call for it and in which it endures and to which they respond; it thus inaugurates, as an active passivity, the whole history of style.

By returning to the region of the Urstiftung, Kaustik argues that Merleau-Ponty can go beyond the problems that dogged the Phenomenology of Perception to the more radical philosophy of reversibility, that of the flesh, without however subsuming the artwork under a general ontology. Through the notion of Urstiftung as revealed and articulated by the history of art and the actual practice of artists, the thoroughly interwoven themes of flesh, temporality, historicity, desire, and expression are taken up in a fresh manner in Kaushik's reading of Merleau-Ponty, beyond any dependence on the philosophy of constituting consciousness partially at work in the Phenomenology. Relative to these themes, the work of art, according to Kaushik, discloses the institution of being that overcomes the ontological difference. These themes are already delineated with sufficient clarity in the "Introduction" to his book, an introduction that effectively lays out for the reader the entire script-plot of the book, and they form its four principal chapters which are so rich and complex that they merit a full length article to do justice to them. Within the space allotted to me, I will limit my review to just these themes.

Kaushik's analyses of the flesh follow Merleau-Ponty's recuperation of Cezanne, Klee, and Matisse in their efforts to capture the primordial and perpetual a priori opening of the open, the gift which is disclosedness, the power of sense making. In other words, Kaushik argues that these painters want to express the fundamental opening of sensibility itself into the sensing and the sensed, which is to capture Nature opening herself ever anew in the dance of reversibility between the touching and seeing involved in the act of painting. It is also the display of Nature herself, within this opening, in the sensing that the sensitive flesh does -- not only of other things, for instance canvas, brush and color, but of itself, the painting hand. For Merleau-Ponty, this flesh is not only the coming to be of phenomenality but a specific phenomenon within it. It is both the primordial instituting power, the wild logos, that opens the world sensibly as world, and that which an instituted and instituting human being is in his/her own very being and experience of the world.

Turning to temporality, Kaushik claims that painting rides the wave of a hidden temporality that swells up from within the things. The work of art indexes the very interiority of temporality itself through which each thing is instituted and that institutes itself by means of auto-manifestation; it is what Merleau-Ponty calls an architectonic time that allows the original event (the madeleine dipped in lime-blossom tea or the hawthorn path at Combray in Proust's Recherche) to endure into the present without needing to fix it or anchor it. Merleau-Ponty claims that this past belongs to a mythical time expressed, as Kaushik points out, in metaphor, thus a metaphorical time which will give a literary account "of the sudden upraising of the abysm in the visible that may at any time surprise the subject and subjective constitution and expose the ultimate falsity of a wholly theoretical interiority"(102). Kaushik concludes that myth and architectonic time thus refer to a unified temporality. It is what Merleau-Ponty refers to in "The Working Notes" as the "vertical past"; it is the past that adheres to the present independent of consciousness -- the past existentially sedimented in the present. This involves a displacing of latent intentionality from the lived body to the world, which he calls the "intentionality within Being". This intentionality is the primordial desire or longing, the originary creativity operative within being (which is another name for Logos Endiathetos, for wild Being), which the painter, through the ontological power of color, brings to expression.

Regarding desire, Kaushik argues that the painter's desire arises from the depth of being as "an organizing principle in the appearance of things" (88), differentiating and relating them, forming a world out of them, ultimately rendering desire a structuration of being itself. For the painter, what is truly the object of desire is not any object as such but "the fullness of the presence of the invisibility from out of which the visible unfolds" (82). Goya's Nude Maja figures into visibility the overflowing of invisible beauty into softness, tenderness, fragility and availability to touch. As Kaushik puts it, "the labor of desire is the very logic of phenomenality coming into presence" (82). The figurative conveys the fragility of the look and thus also "the very structure of desire in its very desiring through which the look is opened and given its fragility" (114). Kaushik points to the intertwining of desire as so described with architectonic and mythical time as found in the little phrase of the sonata heard at the time of Swann's original love for Odette becoming the evocative and expressive site of a polyvalent range of future experiences that perpetually render palpably present and transfigure the original encounter.

For Kaushik, the free movement of the painter's hand opens the ecstatical space of signification; it expresses fundamentally an active principle from which the painter's own expression emerges and is made possible. (59) Thus the painter's autonomous and voluntary singularity is subtended by something outside of itself through which signs take on their full value, something that ruptures the traditional bond between signifier and signified by opening upon an Urstiftung as the place of their estrangement. As with temporality and desire, expression is no longer just a property of the human but belongs to the inner processes of being itself. The chiasmic relation between what is explicitly expressed and that out of which the expressed emerges reveals a new reversibility and the advent of expressive flesh as what institutes speaking and thinking in the world of silence. Kaushik argues that expression requires institution. Although it can be read otherwise (especially since Merleau-Ponty proposes a philosophy of institution that leaves behind the world of Erlebnisse), Kaushik claims that for Merleau-Ponty institution does not usurp expression, that Merleau-Ponty never abandoned expression. It is a matter of grasping and recovering from within expression its instituting ground. As Kaushik puts it, this archeological movement requires an interrogation of expression in order to uncover silent forms of expression, such as we find in Cezanne's or Klee's colors or Matisse's flexuous lines, which do not have recourse to language and which bear witness to a meaning, distant from sign-structures, emerging from a pre-meaningful source in being.

Just a word about Kaushik's reading of Merleau-Ponty's notion of the "flesh of history" relative to painting. Kaushik argues that there is a carnal ground, a carnal Urhistorie, that sustains painterly working, binding into an epochal style a particular differentiation between brushwork, coloration, and technical procedures, for instance that of impressionism or expressionism. The singular gesture of pictorial expression, the specific artistic idiom in its historico-materiality, for instance Caravaggio's use of chiaroscuro, also secretly refers to every other idiom across history by virtue of a communality in their origination. This is the flesh of history making style a living historicity. In each brushstroke there is literally an inscription of historical events, "a way of being that is always already delimited as an individual's historical, cultural territory and normative significance." (46)

Kaushik concludes with a poignant set of reflections on the notion of the obscure as it pertains to both art and phenomenology. He takes up Husserl's notion of an obscure zone within the field of appearing relative to which differentiation takes place, and shows that for Merleau-Ponty the indeterminacy of language and the image is rooted in the incessant escape of touching from the touch, their differentiation through non-coincidence, thus opening up the primal region of the obscure revealed by the work of art in its auto-figuration.

In his 'Introduction,' Kaushik cites Merleau-Ponty's famous claim that" the ultimate task of phenomenology as a philosophy of consciousness is to understand its relationship to non- phenomenology. What resists phenomenology within us -- natural being . . ." (5). It is instructive that Kaushik does not complete the citation, in which Merleau-Ponty refers to natural being as "the barbarous source Schelling spoke of." In fact, no explicit taking up of Merleau-Ponty's reading of Schelling occurs in this book. Instead, natural being is defined as "a genesis of sense that emerges from out of a logos, which has made itself available in the phenomenon." (5) Whether this logos is equivalent to Urstiftung is not explicitly stated but would appear to be intended. It is interesting to note that the barbarous source of which Schelling spoke is an Abgrund relative to which it could be argued that the logos would be a secondary formation and power. However, Kaushik does echo Schelling when, in relation to sculpture, he refers to a "wild logos and a brute principle of an unfolding abysm into the present" (121), "of the sudden upraising of the abysm in the visible" (102); in relation to the literary work, sculpture and music, he writes that the brute ground of phenomenality is in the manner in which it appears, prior to human cognition. Again echoing Schelling, Kaushik claims that for Merleau-Ponty this brute ground, this wild logos is natural being arising into the open from out of itself; it is the apparitional force that inheres within and structures the unfolding of the palpating life of phenomenality into difference, into the visible and vision, into exterior and interior, a profundity retrieved in each act of painting and which continues to make appearance possible; it is the incarnated principle that is the very power of emergence in the formation of entities. (22) Is this wild logos the same as Logos Endiathetos which Merleau-Ponty equates with Being in Heidegger's sense? In his Introduction, Kaushik defines Logos Endiathetos as the word conceived (35), and this passive rendering appears quite contrary to the more active process that Merleau-Ponty intends as the sense of the term. Although Kaushik claims that he is not conducting an historical analysis, his book would be greatly enriched had he developed more fully and explicitly the place of Schelling's philosophy of the Abgrund in relation to Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of art.

No discussion of Merleau-Ponty's recuperation of the thought of Henri Bergson's occurs in this work. The intentionality which encompasses the vertical past can be explicated as a kind of carnal temporality or duration, in the manner of Bergson's Matter and Memory, as an ongoing process whereby the present, in its novelty, both incorporates the past and opens to an ever-emergent future, a duration inherent to material events and processes and not simply to consciousness. For Bergson and for Merleau-Ponty, this latent intentionality or duration is an active process of self-differentiation. It unfolds in a succession of heterogeneous phases and constitutes a qualitative multiplicity of interrelatedness as an ever-emergent creative novelty. The sheer advance of the present over the past involves the ascription of some minimal novel agency internal to the present, its survival in the present, internalized at the moment it is being transcended. Kaushik's analyses of temporality would be significantly enhanced by taking-up the impact of Bergson's notion of creativity on Merleau-Ponty's aesthetics.

In spite of these critical observations, Rajiv Kaushik succeeds in showing that Merleau-Ponty liberates his later thought from all the traces of Husserl's transcendental phenomenology in which the ecstatic essence of human existence is understood as standing-out from the immanence of consciousness. In my judgment, Rajiv Kaushik's Art and Institution is a book of intrinsic merit, an original work whose scope, profundity, and daring radically reconfigure and revitalize Merleau-Ponty's aesthetics and shape the contours of a new research agenda for the emerging generation of Merleau-Ponty scholars.