Art and Intention: A Philosophical Study

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Paisley Livingston, Art and Intention: A Philosophical Study, Oxford University Press, 2005, 272 pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199278067.

Reviewed by Dan Dahlstrom, Boston University


Richly informed, crisply written, and thoughtfully argued, Art and Intention makes a strong case for the role that intentions play and ought to be considered to play in producing and appreciating works of art. Intentions, in the author's highly plausibly understanding of them, are not always conscious or successfully realized; nor does he think that we can expect to appreciate a work's meanings in every case simply by understanding the artist's intentions. But there are also ample reasons for thinking that we will often fail to understand the individual or collective production of a work of art, its difference from texts and relation to other works in a single oeuvre, a proper interpretation of it, and, in some cases, its fictional status if we fail to pay attention to the relevant intentions. Livingston elegantly marshals these reasons in what is bound to be a major resource for philosophical thinking on the subject of intentions in art.

In the opening chapter, Livingston presents a general account of intentions and a defense of the viability of intentionalist discourse. He takes an intention to be a kind of propositional attitude, the content of which is a plan for doing something. To have the attitude of intending something is to have a firm yet defeasible commitment to executing some plan. Since there is time for making adjustments between the time the intending begins and the time the plan is executed, various philosophers distinguish future-oriented intentions and those presently acted upon ("intentions in action"). Livingston resists this temptation, arguing instead that prior and future-directed intentions (even proximal ones), while prior to the intended action, can, if not frustrated or altered, sustain and continue to guide its progress as long as the intended plan is not completed. In this connection Livingston invokes a helpful distinction between executing an intention (in the sense of performing or trying to perform "some action guided by the plan embedded in that intention") and realizing it (executing the intention and achieving a state of affairs specified by the plan, where the achievement is not a matter of deviant causal chains or sheer luck). While not necessarily deliberate or conscious, intentions prompt and terminate the process of deliberation, coordinating an individual agent's behavior over time. At the same time, this notion that the intention to do or to try to do something is a necessary condition for performing an intentional action is, he notes, compatible with unintended consequences of that action and the recognition of "unpredictable and spontaneous moments in our lives" (14).

Having attempted in this manner to give a plausible account of "the salient aspects of the roles of intentions in our lives as agents" (16), Livingston addresses the contention that intentionalist discourse is fundamentally erroneous. Since intentionalist notions inform anti-intentionalist positions, the anti-intentionalists are faced with a problem of internal consistency, leaving them, Livingston notes, with two equally unpalatable options, that of adopting a double standard or contextualist strategy towards such discourse or of working toward its elimination. Yet Livingston also recognizes both that the present or even future necessity of intentionalist discourse does not ensure its truth and that arguments in support of the fundamental character of intentionalist discourse seem to beg the question. Hence, instead of embracing a 'transcendental' or a priori argument for intentional realism, he makes a modest case for it by raising doubts about not only the coherence of anti-intentionalism but also the adequacy of its reductionist assumptions (such as the assumption of micophysics' causal completeness and fundamental status).

Livingston applies his general account of intentions to artistic production in Chapter 2. Without assuming that there is a single process that is associated with artistic creativity or that every aspect of it can be explained, he argues that there are some typical features of paradigmatic cases of artistic creativity and that intentions are integral aspects of these features. After dismissing as unconvincing supposed counterexamples to the thesis that art is an intentional activity, Livingston justifies the role of intentions axiologically: an artwork as such must be evaluable in terms of the artistry or lack thereof that went into its production. This bold claim resurrects a long-standing controversy about the role that skill should play in aesthetic evaluation. While the suggestion that artworks be identifiable in terms of an evaluatory criterion seems right and there is ample evidence of appreciation of artworks in terms of the skill involved in their production, Livingston owes us, I think, a larger story here, a fuller account of what is entailed by artistry and why artistry should serve in this capacity. For example, if evaluation of artistry demanded understanding of the process and tradition of production that went into a work, we might conceivably be precluded in some cases from being able to make evaluations of artistic skill and nevertheless be justified in identifying some artifact as art by reason of other qualities. (In such a case, intentions remain necessary to the artificial and not the artistic character of the work.)

Building on the general theory of the opening chapter, Livingston argues that intentions "in our ordinary and unanalysed sense of the term" may be conscious or unconscious and that distal (schematic) intentions, emergent and occasionally spontaneous proximal intentions, and temporally mixed ones may all play a role in a developing creative process. Critically adapting traditional psychological accounts of creativity, Livingston counters excessive Romantic (and poststructuralist) claims for inspiration by noting its interplay with processes of preparation and incubation, on the one hand, and verification and elaboration, on the other. Creation of art is typically a long and painstaking process, contradicting "the false choice between inspiration and the rational application of a technique or method" (33). The virtue of Livingston's account here is that it also gives these equally unquestionable yet contrary aspects of the creative process their due. He effectively glosses passages from Virginia Woolf's diaries to amplify these aspects of the artistic process and her own struggle to negotiate the horns of what he calls "Bratman's dilemma," viz., "unpremeditated scribbling," on the one hand, and execution of "prior intentions that prove inappropriate," on the other. Finally, Livingston addresses the role often significantly played by intentions in terminating artistic activity. A work, he argues, can be said to be complete aesthetically and/or genetically (by virtue of the artist's decision to stop and a retrospective judgment that the work is complete). "In a range of relatively simple cases," as he puts it, and as evidenced by our customary attitudes towards works interrupted by death or circumstances, the artist's decision is key to a work's completion, though this genetic attitude is merely necessary but not sufficient to establish that the finished product is a work of art. (The chapter concludes with a review of senses of 'fragment' in light of these considerations.)

In Chapter 3 Livingston addresses the matter of authorship and the ways in which authorship can be collective. After noting both the historical unsoundness of the Foucaultian claim that the author-function only emerged in the early modern context and the implausibility of Foucaultian construals of the author as merely a readership's projection, Livingston proposes a broad, intentional definition of authorship, applying to all utterances, ordinary as well as artistic. According to this definition, an author is an agent who intentionally makes an utterance with the aim of expressing or communicating. While the aim or plan here may be schematic, the aim of the expression is the public indication of a mental state or attitude. Communication is said to differ from expression by trying to get the audience to recognize the attitude in the right way. This broad conception of authorship, Livingston points out, does not entail "strong intentionalism" (the view that the meaning of the work is entirely determined by its author's intentions). While this general approach strikes me as eminently sensible, I am puzzled by Livingston's remark that "no specific social formations, even less institutions, are necessary conditions of authorship" (75). In this connection I would plea for clarification since the remark might suggest quite implausibly that either the expression or the communication necessarily involved in authorship could be on hand without some specific social formation.

Having staked out this general position on authorship, Livingston turns to the knotty issues of collaborative authorship. With a set of instructive examples (e.g., composers genuinely collaborating on a song) and counterexamples (e.g., a film produced by a series of film-makers hired and fired in succession by warring producers, a publication of an autobiography secretly written by a ghost writer), Livingston makes a compelling case that genuine joint authorship involves at least some measure of shared overall intentions that are acted upon (e.g., selection of the sort of work envisioned), shared decisions and control, action in accordance with "meshing sub-plans", and taking responsibility together for the results. (It bears noting that Livingston gives confusing signals on whether the example of one person providing the score, another the orchestration, still others advising is an instance of joint authorship or not; see pp. 85, 88). Livingston ends the chapter by noting how his definition needs to be altered if the authorship is artistic. The solution is "to replace the expression of attitudes by means of utterances or works with an emphasis on the intentional creation of works having artistically relevant qualities" (89). But the solution, Livingston acknowledges, is also extremely difficult to elaborate since the distinction between artistically relevant and irrelevant qualities or, equivalently, a definition of art, is wanting.

Chapter 4 presents Livingston's contribution to the problem of intra-oeuvral relations. He begins by taking issue with Levinson's appeal to second-order intentions to defend "forward retroactivism," the interpretation of a work's artistic content on the basis of a relation to features of a subsequent work. The relevant second-order intentions may simply be wanting or amiss and, even if one supposes that the artist creates a work (W1) with the intention that subsequent works will inflect its meaning, the supposition does not entail that W1 actually has "non-proleptic, first-order semantic properties relative to some subsequent" work (97). Equally problematic, Livingston submits, given the normal changes in a person's attitudes and intentions over time, is Levinson's occasional suggestion that we take an artist's works "as if they constituted the elements of a single utterance" (98). In order to suggest how intentions are, nonetheless, relevant to significant intra-oeuvral relations, Livingston delves into the different possible courses of events that could lead to them (i.e., cases where the relation is intended, unintended, or the combination of intended and unintended results). A discussion of Karen Blixen's self-translations aptly demonstrates that intra-oeuvral relations need not have been intended at any point by the author.

Can an account of intentions usefully be applied to the problem of distinguishing texts from works? In regard to this central question of Chapter 5, Livingston develops a conception of texts that reflects "a valuable, well-entrenched, and prevalent manner of identifying a text in literature" (124). After ruling out a purely syntactical approach to textual identity (on the grounds that exactness of character type is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition of such identity) as well as pragmatic approaches (since they vitiate the text/work distinction), Livingston proposes a locutionary conception of texts that allows such things as illocutionary force and generic affiliation to provide a means for determining the identity of the work. "Reference to intentions is necessary … to the identification of a collection of sentences constitutive of the primary token of a locutionary text," a text that can then be said to be replicated if other tokens instantiate "all and only the same intended characters" in the same notation scheme (allowing for some acceptable deviations, e.g., alternative spellings, if they are not incompatible with the author's relevant intentions) (123). With Livingston's own caveat that there will be controversial, borderline case in regard to replication, this locutionary/illocutionary distinction provides a way of separating criteria for the identity of a text and for that of a work.

In the book's final chapters, Livingston develops a moderate or partial intentionalist theory of interpretation (Chapter 6) and applies it to questions of fiction and fictional truth (Chapter 7). The presence of unsuccessful or unrealized intentions on the part of the artist makes absolute intentionalism unpalatable and the existence of intended implicit meanings (e.g., irony) cannot be cashed out in terms of conventions and context alone, as anti-intentionalists contend. As to the knotty problem of standards for judging the successfulness of the intended, implicit meaning, Livingston proposes the default standard "that the intentions are compatible and 'mesh' with the linguistic and conventional meanings of the text or artifact taken in its target or intended context" (155). This moderate or partial intentionalism is superior, he submits, to both fictional intentionalism and hypothetical intentionalism. Livingston's debunking of the former is sweeping, succinct, and powerful. His problems with hypothetical intentionalism center on its supposition of a difference between an artist's categorial intention (e.g., to paint) and semantic intentions (e.g., to convey a meaning), such that the former plays or ought to play an evidentiary role, the latter a merely suggestive role in interpretation. Livingston argues that the distinction is sometimes unwieldy, given certain borderline cases, and the difference in status accorded the two intentions unjustified. While he rightly pounces on ambiguities in Levinson's account of this distinction, more, it seems to me, needs to be said to make these arguments. On the basis of an understanding of an artist's creative process, interpreters of artworks often make a workable distinction between the two kinds of intention, even if they are in some sense interdependent and in some cases inextricably joined (something that Levinson need not be interpreted as denying). It is noteworthy in this connection that Livingston himself continues to employ something akin to the distinction between categorial and semantic intentions, even as he contests "that we do not have any systematic way to separate the categorial wheat from the semantic chaff." Thus in the same context he sums up his position by asserting "that the theory of appreciation and interpretation should be attuned to the artist's constitutive role in the making of works. It is the artist who makes the work, and settling on categories and meanings is part of the creative process" (164; see, too, 180). Livingston's final chapter sketches an intentional analysis of fictions and fictional truth. On the former analysis, intentions targeting make-believe or imagining are at least part of what gives an utterance its fictional status. He proposes that fictional truth be elucidated in terms of the appropriateness of make-believe in response to a work's content, where the appropriateness, while generally permissive, may be restricted in particular cases by a goal of understanding fictional utterances in the author's artistic context.