Art and Morality

Placeholder book cover

Bermudez, Jose and Gardner, Sebastian (eds.), Art and Morality, Routledge, 2003, 320pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415192528.

Reviewed by Amy Mullin, University of Toronto


The fourteen essays gathered in this volume by José Bermúdez and Sebastian Gardner were originally conceived as a tribute to the Cambridge philosopher, Michael Tanner. Two of the essays are by Tanner, including the only previously published piece (his essay “Sentimentality”). All of the chapters discuss relations between artworks and morality, broadly conceived, either in ways specifically in harmony with Tanner’s suggestion that there is considerable overlap between aesthetic and moral concepts (Bermúdez makes the same point about decadence that Tanner makes about sentimentality), or by suggesting, again with Tanner, that artworks can contribute to moral understanding by offering richly detailed accounts of particular perspectives on issues that are central to morality.

The book opens with an introduction which explains the rationale of the volume, groups the essays, and briefly characterizes the argument of each chapter. The essays are divided by the editors into two parts. Those in the first part explore the themes above in relatively general terms, and in a manner usually consistent with recent work in analytic aesthetics, with some reference to particular artworks (chiefly literary) and some discussion of figures in the history of philosophy. The essays in the second part come in two varieties. Two concern themselves in a more detailed way with certain art media. John Armstrong offers a strong argument in favor of his claim that pictures can deepen moral understanding through the use of specifically artistic means, and Roger Scruton analyzes Richard Wagner’s Ring in order to demonstrate that Wagner’s music conveys a particular moral vision. The only artworks reproduced in the book are found in these two chapters, which include excerpts from Wagner, and reprints of two paintings, one by Poussin and one by Sassetta. The remaining five chapters engage in extensive analysis of philosophical works by Kant, Nietzsche and Schopenhauer. Since the essays in both parts of the book are influenced by Tanner, it is perhaps not surprising that references to Wagner, Nietzsche and Schopenhauer are found quite frequently throughout the volume, particularly in the second part, but this does make for a rather idiosyncratic selection from the history of philosophy. One potential strength of the volume, its ability to cross the divide between analytic and continental work in philosophy, is somewhat diminished by the narrow range of continental philosophers drawn upon.

Many of the essays in the first part offer valuable contributions to contemporary debates within analytic aesthetics. For instance, essays by Matthew Kieran and Christopher Hamilton engage with work by Noel Carroll and Berys Gaut, among others, who explore the ways in which artworks express perspectives on morality, and who question whether some moral merits of artworks should be considered artistic merits. Kieran offers a spirited defense of immoralism, or the view that moral defects can contribute to the artistic value of a work, in part because he holds that “imaginatively experiencing morally defective cognitive-affective responses and attitudes in ways that are morally problematic can deepen one’s understanding and appreciation” (72). Hamilton argues that some involved in the abovementioned debate are too quick to equate the moral relevance of certain features of an artwork with a particular valency, good or bad. He also reminds us that when we are discussing the moral character of artworks, we should not exaggerate the extent to which those who respond to them have fixed moral views, or suppose that increased understanding will necessarily lead to moral betterment. He writes: “Even where a work of art does effect a clarification in our moral thinking, I can see no good reason why this must be one which is friendly to morality. It could make one more hostile to morality” (39). This point seems pertinent to Kieran’s argument, and this was one of several places where I wish the individual chapters had made reference to one another (several do cite Tanner’s writings, including his essay reprinted here, but none engage to any extent with the chapters not written by Tanner). Mary Mothersill’s arguments about why one may refuse imaginative engagement with particular artworks is another essay in the volume which makes an important contribution to a contemporary debate. Proceeding chiefly by critical engagement with the works of Tanner and Kendall Walton on the topic, she makes use of Richard Moran’s distinction between hypothetical and dramatic imagination to explore why one might be unwilling to enter into dramatic imagination along the lines encouraged by a work of art. However, I did think her essay promised slightly more than it delivered in terms of a focus on reasons for refusing to do so which relate to the moral character of the work, even when that work is not sermonizing.

Essays in the second part, in addition to the two by Armstrong and Scruton discussed above, explore such topics as whether Kant’s account of the ideal of beauty undermines the sharp distinction he makes in some places between beauty and morality (Anthony Savile’s essay), the ethical significance of tragedy (essays by both Alex Neill and Sebastian Gardner), and the connection between art and philosophy in Nietzsche (Christopher Janaway’s chapter). Some of these essays are closer to straightforward textual interpretation than others (Neill’s is perhaps the closest), but all situate their analysis of the texts they study with reference to the larger themes of the book. The essays do not make reference to one another, but they are read quite usefully in conjunction with one another, including Lyas’ essay which continues the focus on Nietzsche and Wagner that runs through many of the essays in the latter half of the book.

Overall my chief criticism of the book is that the essays in both of its parts pay far more attention to exploring how artworks function than they do to exploring the meaning of morality. Most operate with a rather open-ended conception of morality which more or less coincides with all important questions about how we should live. Many of the essays devote at most a paragraph to explaining what they meant by morality or ethics (the two terms are typically used interchangeably). Armstrong’s essay, which devotes two pages to the issue, and Tanner’s opening essay, pay more attention to the topic than all but two of the other essays in the volume. The two exceptions to the tendency to shortchange discussion of the nature of morality are both found in the second group of essays: Sebastian Gardner’s essay (not coincidentally, at 41 pages, more than twice as long as most of the other chapters) and Colin Lyas’ chapter (which concludes the book). Gardner explores connections between tragedy and morality, in an argument that defends the claim that tragedy may be philosophically significant by undermining the moral point of view. Lyas argues, on the basis chiefly of Nietzsche’s philosophy and Wagner’s art, that we should contrast a government of law with a government of love. He connects the former with morality, interprets it as obsessed with punishment, and favors the latter, arguing that artworks can help us either to criticize or to overcome the false appeal of morality. Therefore the two essays which explore the nature of morality are the two which find it wanting. If the majority of the essays (which are by and large more favorably disposed towards morality) had operated with a narrower, more clearly defined conception of morality, this would have sharpened the connection they sought to make between art and morality. Aaron Ridley’s essay on the ethical nature of art criticism, for instance, argues that the job of the art critic is ethically significant at least in part because the critic must strive for accuracy, but this does nothing to distinguish art criticism from any other knowledge-seeking enterprise. While other aspects of Ridley’s arguments do engage more specifically with features he attributes to art criticism (for instance he claims a good art critic must be or become clear about the nature of his or her values), more attention to the specific nature of ethical values (as opposed to values overall) would have made the connection between art criticism and ethics clearer. Even though most of the contributors to the volume are in agreement with Tanner’s point that some concepts (including sentimentality, decadence, and style) have both ethical and aesthetic significance, this need not and should not commit them to the view that the ethical is coincident with the realm of value, for this would make connections between the ethical and the aesthetic banal in that the latter would be one species of the former.

Overall, while there may not be many who would be equally interested in all of the essays in the volume, the various chapters both cumulatively and individually make a strong case for the value of understanding many artworks as expressing views of life which can lead those who respond to them to clarify, question, reject, or renew a commitment to various values which are enacted in dimensions of life which have nothing at all obvious to do with art or aesthetics. The editors have done an excellent job of collecting essays by a number of leading scholars in aesthetics on this important topic.