Art and Objects

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Graham Harman, Art and Objects, Polity, 2020, 204pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781509512683.

Reviewed by Casey Haskins, Purchase College, SUNY


Who says that artistic formalism -- with its celebration of the art object's autonomy and disdain for worldly purposes, representations and tastes -- withered away under the assaults of postmodern cultural critique? Not Graham Harman, chief spokesman and main creator of the Speculative Realist spinoff movement known as Object Oriented Ontology (aka OOO). This book argues that when we experience art -- meaning in principle any kind of art, although Harman focuses almost exclusively on painting -- "beholder and artwork fuse jointly into a third and higher object." Such a weird formalism, as Harman calls it, pushes back against the anti-aesthetic orthodoxies that prevailed in late twentieth century art history and criticism, in order to "renew focus on what is living and dead in Kant's approach to art." Harman particularly seeks to revive the Third Critique's seminal and much-debated theme of autonomy, applied now (as Kant never quite did himself) to fine art and reconfigured with further ideas from Heidegger, Husserl, formalist critics Clement Greenberg and Michael Fried, and actor-network theorist Bruno Latour.

What is new in this book is its placement of Modernist Criticism's object-focused interpretations of autonomy on a new ontological footing. Pushing back against modern philosophy's domination by correlationism -- the tendency to portray reality as inaccessible to us apart from rational thought, epitomized by various strains of empiricism and rationalism -- OOO maintains that reality is ultimately comprised not of relations or processes but of objects. (For useful background, see Harman's 2018 Object-Oriented Ontology: A New Theory of Everything.) Objects here include not just physical things like rocks, mountains and paintings, but anything that resists reduction to its simpler components or to its functional roles within larger systemic contexts. Objects have an emergent reality which is not, pace transcendental idealism, dependent on the constructive powers of human reason. They enter into explanatory relationships only in piecemeal and external ways.

Given certain current global realities, the last point has a provocative edge. For the OOO world is one of primal independence and almost-monadic disconnection. Each of its objects has an integrity which resists forms of understanding that involve either "undermining" (reductively explaining it in terms of its smaller components) or "overmining" (explaining it functionally or in terms of what it does, rather than in terms of what it is). In rejecting all traditional forms of metaphysical materialism and idealism, OOO is also flat. Against entrenched modernist tradition, it holds that there exists no fundamental qualitative divide between natural and cultural entities. OOO-style objects also, importantly, exist apart from thinkers in a radically realist sense that eschews ideal construction à la Kant. They also possess a fundamental explanatory independence from any kind of causal/compositional backstory along with a noumenally withdrawn, internally dark and mysterious character, not only for us but also even for one another.

In its implications for aesthetics, OOO offers a radicalized version of what in the analytic- aesthetics literature (which Harman, attuned more to Continental writers, largely ignores) is known as autonomism. For the multifaceted explanatory independence of artworks turns out now to be but one case of the above-described autonomy of all objects whatsoever. Harman conjoins the Heideggerian theme of never-fully-disclosed beings to Ortega y Gasset's idea that works of art afford aesthetic pleasure "by making it seem that the inwardness of things, their executant reality, is opened to us." When a person beholds the lines and shapes and colors on a painting's canvas they have direct access to that object's sensory qualities but they can never know the object's real qualities. Here, as in mainstream Idealist accounts, aesthetic experience thrives on a kind of immanence/transcendence gap or tension in our encounters with art objects. Along with its Heideggerian strains, this argument partially echoes Kant's theme of beauty as an enjoyable kind of cognitive blockage, marked by the pleasurable feeling that a beautiful object has the form of finality without finality of form (a.k.a. Zweckmässigkeit ohne Zweck or purposiveness without purpose).

This formalism's post-Kantian weirdness emerges more clearly when we consider its further claim that the phenomenally absent artwork-in-itself prompts the beholder not only to imaginatively supply its missing qualities but, Harman says sometimes, to fuse with the noumenal object and create a new one. (This all accords with OOO's rules of permissible object-formation, which often have the stipulative feel of rules for a board game.) Harman elsewhere suggests that one doesn't fuse with the absent object so much as performatively enact it, as a masked actor performs a part onstage. One learns little here about the creative agency of artists themselves. On the other hand, the beholder or critic acquires a newly exalted status as a kind of autonomously active second-order artist whose life, when in that para-theatrical role, takes on an experiential richness not captured by the blander Kantian idiom of "disinterested" aesthetic spectators. While that traditional kind of disinterest is pre-empted by OOO's anti-correlationism, other kinds of autonomous worldly disengagement remain important. A key practical and cultural-political continuity between OOO formalism and some earlier modernist versions is evident, for example, in Harman's belief that one reason we value art is that the "extra-aesthetic world is so often boring, depressing, and stupefyingly familiar." (But try telling that to anyone who believes, as did Kant himself, along with some later romantics, that the beauties of nature surpass those of the art salons in their freedom from social vanity and intimations of noumenal mystery. Or indeed try telling it to any artist whose worldly experiences, including experiences of political fragmentation and struggle, fuel the meanings of their work. More of this below.)

At the core of the critic's object-enactive process is metaphor. Rather than being simply a device for allowing us to communicate thoughts and feelings that are inexpressible in literal language, metaphor becomes here a radical strategy for actively creating a bridge across the art object's real qualities and sensory qualities. Indeed metaphor now becomes a kind of deep performance art in which "the beholder is called upon . . . to stand in for the missing object and support the qualities that were only half-plausibly assigned to it." (p. 69) Our experience of a tension between the phenomenally present and absent aspects of an object allows us in turn also to experience an artwork as not only interesting or pleasing but, in a radically pluralized sense, as beautiful.

Not all artworks do this equally. Following Fried, Harman argues that the enemy not only of metaphorical understanding generally but of authentic experiences of art is literalism. Literalism is a symptom of any artworks (which, for Fried, meant especially Minimalist sculptures) that present themselves as being phenomenologically continuous with things in the outside extra-aesthetic world. One of the best sections of the book is Harman's close critical rereading of Fried's groundbreaking 1967 essay "Art and Objecthood," and later writings. Pushing back against what he (like many others now) finds overly zealous in Fried's distinction between the vulgar theatricality of paintings that cater to the viewer's sense of personal worldly connection to the subject matter (which is in turn symptomatic of literalism) and the biographically self-effacing attitude of absorption which paintings of the highest quality supposedly elicit, Harman argues that an austere strain of theatricality is in fact integral to the aesthetic experience of any work. This is all a consequence of OOO's allowance for the fusing of beholder and object. Theater now becomes "just another form of absorption . . . there is no radical difference between painting and beholder such that to cross the boundary from one to the other is to enter the kingdom of art."

Later chapters apply this theatrically reinfused formalism to an assortment of modernist- and postmodernist-era developments. Dada and Surrealism receive particular attention, and Harman offers neo-Friedian critiques of various celebrated postmodern-era artists -- Cindy Sherman, Barbara Kruger, and Thomas Hirschhorn, among others -- who he thinks push the theatrical envelope too far in the direction of incorporating overtly autobiographical and/or social themes into their work. Further attention is given along the way to a diverse set of theorists and critics including Bruno Latour, T.J. Clark, Rosalind Krauss, Harold Rosenberg, Leo Steinberg, Jacques Ranciere, Slavoj Žižek, Arthur Danto (the only analytic aesthetician discussed in the book), and Hal Foster. (Harman takes particular issue with Foster, who is best known as the editor of the 1983 The Anti-Aesthetic: Essays on Postmodern Culture and whose celebration of such tendencies in postmodern art as the archival, the mimetic, and the precarious Harman finds inimical to art's autonomy.)

Is this passionate and provocative vision of What is Art persuasive? That depends on whom you ask in a field that, as Adorno famously noted in what now seems an understatement, lacks anything remotely like self-evident principles. Harman's prose, unlike much writing in academic aesthetics, is clear and personable; his references to authors and intellectual and artistic movements are wide-ranging and jargon-free. Such qualities can make his vision of art's wondrously unworldly depths at least an intriguing thought experiment even for everyone nowadays who regards form, in some sense of that term, as integral to any aesthetic experience worth pursuing in the arts but who find various kinds of high-modernist formalism about as palatable as religious pluralists find the teachings of fundamentalism.

Given all the things people today believe about art, even the most considered efforts at grand aesthetic theorizing face fateful tradeoffs of focus and audience. Aficionados of music or dance or literature might bristle at Harman's practice (in which he is admittedly not alone) of casually using "art" as a synonym for "painting, sculpture, and architecture." This needn't just be a terminological quibble. For example, how persuasively can an OOO analysis account for a completely improvised jazz performance that lacks a score, goes unrecorded, and cannot be hung or mounted? A more general concern may be felt by anyone who wonders whether an OOO approach prematurely excludes certain comparably deep intuitions about art's ontology. If we are to go the route of grand aesthetic theorizing, why should we necessarily characterize art, in all its definition-defying diversity, as consisting fundamentally of objects? Why not think of art instead in terms of, say, processes? Or why not think of it as residing fundamentally in actions, or even in mutually transformative transactions between human actors and environments? This was the approach of John Dewey's Art as Experience, a still widely-read modernist era book that receives (like the rest of the literature of pragmatist aesthetics) no mention here. It might have afforded Harman an interesting foil for his own views, given Dewey's fondness for organicist intuitions in accounting for all the empirical data this OOO argument addresses, within another version of flat ontology rooted in an emergent naturalism. (Harman, who has no patience for organicism or naturalism, is a fan of emergence.)

A more significant absence than Dewey's from Harman's narrative is that of Adorno. Besides remaining the premier theorist of artistic autonomy since Kant, Adorno was in fact as indebted to Kant as to Hegel and Marx in his aesthetics. Anyone who would make a new move in the aesthetic-and-artistic autonomy game nowadays ignores a key Adornean point on pain of losing their readers very quickly. This is that the autonomy idea is both indispensable to taking art seriously and inadequate as a basis for a unified aesthetic theory, given its stubbornly dialectical and antinomical relationship to heteronomy. What that dialectic means is that there is a certain autonomistic-and-heteronomistic "doubleness" that not even the most formalistically advanced artworks can escape. Rather than debate Adorno (along with many earlier critics who struggled to reconcile Idealist-style intuitions about the historically transcendent power of classic artworks with Materialist-style observations about their historical particularity), Harman declares impatience with "Frankfurter Hegelians" who "sink into holistic laziness and contend that nothing can be disentangled from anything else."

Harman makes what indeed starts to seem a new move in the autonomy game by construing everything in the world as an autonomous object. He also gestures toward the contemporary autonomy conversation in a section on Jacques Rancière's post-Adornean argument about the dissensus at the heart of the aesthetic regime. But his discussion in the end falls back on the old high-modernist practice of classifying artworks of the highest quality as falling non-negotiably on the autonomy side of an autonomy-heteronomy fault line that insulates them from all of the aesthetically impure pleasures and purposes that fill ordinary historical experience. This is a traditional aesthetician's analogue to the practice, all but extinct now in philosophy of mind, of supposing that any occurrence in human experience needs to be classified neatly either as a mental event or a bodily event. The clunkiness of such thinking had a lot to do with the Greenberg-Fried tradition's failures to account for the intentional complexities of various kinds of visual and nonvisual art that have emerged in recent decades.

Such recent artworld developments invite even those who are drawn to formalist arguments to consider that the autonomy-heteronomy distinction has as much of an evolutionary history as anything else in our cultural lives. If we take this point seriously, it is but a short step to the further thought that the distinction is most illuminating when applied not in the old clunkily dualistic fashion but in newly contextualizing ways. This is especially important if one is sympathetically to grasp the work of any number of artists who understand what they create as embodying some version of the autonomistic-and-heteronomistic "doubleness" that Adorno described.

Any de-contextualizing argument about art itself occurs within some context or other. Harman's argument appears in the context of a century when the future forms of what we have only since Kant's era called aesthetic phenomena and aesthetic theorizing are anyone's guess. It will be interesting to see, as this culturally uncertain era moves forward, if some version of an object-based approach to art's ontology can be made persuasive to more than just those who identify art mainly with pictures and who still think of pictures as a connoisseurly compensation for all that is depressing and boring outside the artworld. (Lowbrow relatives of that same modernist world-rejecting attitude are now going viral, for better and for worse, among those who seek their aesthetic fulfillment in the mysterious depths of digitalized virtual space.) The modern idea of art as being, in some sense, a special autonomous realm with an inside and an outside is in fact itself also a kind of metaphorical, higher-order picture. It remains, again, a valuable and evolving one. But to paraphrase Wittgenstein (another voice worth including in a book that purports to advance our conversations about what is involved in defining a term as open-textured as "art"), some pictures -- meaning now styles of philosophical thought -- can hold us captive in ways that give us good reason to get outside them.

Might our healthiest relationship to the autonomy picture nowadays be one that is not all-or-nothing, as many modernists thought (and as Harman believes), but half-in and half-out? The half-out part is important. It leaves all of us who love exploring the mysterious depths of all kinds of art additional space for recognizing that a lot of the extra-aesthetic world is anything but familiar or boring. It is also a world full of objects that are beautiful, mysterious, often living, sometimes endangered, and -- in at least some ways that the best art and philosophy of the future might help us further understand -- deeply connected.