Art and Pornography: Philosophical Essays

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Hans Maes and Jerrold Levinson (eds.), Art and Pornography: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2012, 335pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199609581.

Reviewed by Natalie Nenadic, University of Kentucky


Until recently, reflection on pornography has come mainly from outside philosophy.[1] Feminism, a leading source of this reflection, first addressed pornography in a major way through social and political developments of the 1970s and 1980s to confront the consequences to women of pornography's new and rapid encroachment in the public and private spheres. Aiming to understand how "pornography works in everyday life,"[2] feminism gathered the findings of such immediate sources as survivor testimonies, sociological and psychological studies, health professionals, and simply mapping the content of the vast majority of pornography. The result was that another understanding of pornography broke surface for the first time, centering on its role in affecting women's social inequality. This understanding challenged a prevailing one that variously revolved around the neutral notion that pornography is simply sexually explicit material intended for sexual arousal. Feminism revealed that pornography's sexually explicit content is overwhelmingly about showing and endorsing sexual means of harming people, mainly women, and conditioning consumers' arousal to cues that present women as sexually vulnerable and violable, for instance, enjoying pain, humiliation, rape, being tied up, cut up, mutilated, bruised, being sexually submissive, reduced to their sexual body parts, etc.,[3] content whose violence against and degradation of women has since this period dramatically escalated.[4]

Catharine MacKinnon, a pioneer of these developments, summarized some of their implications, which compel us to rethink clear lines that have been drawn between pornography and other areas of life and culture, including art, so as to appreciate previously hidden continuities between them insofar as they thus promote women's inequality, and otherwise to ask new questions of these areas. She remarks, in strikingly Heideggerian language, that

the exposure of pornography's harms has moved the ground under social theory across a wide range of issues. The place of sex in . . . art . . . has been thrown open to reconsideration . . . As events that have been hidden come to light, the formerly unseen appears to determine more and more of the seen. The repercussions for theory, the requisite changes in thinking on all levels of society, have only begun to be felt.[5]

So too have they begun to be felt in philosophical treatment of art, as is evident in Hans Maes and Jerrold Levinson's Art and Pornography, the first essay collection on pornography "by . . . analytic philosopher[s] of art" (p. 2). The book centers on reexamining whether pornography and erotic art are indeed inherently incompatible. It contains fourteen chapters arranged in four thematic sections, with this question threaded through them. While pornography's main message about women is unavoidable from one's first encounter with this volume -- at the center of its cover illustration artwork are the open splayed legs of an unclothed woman on her back, passive and apparently headless -- only a few of the chapters are more substantively informed by this key feature of pornography or otherwise lend themselves to thinking about it. These few, however, make important strides in advancing our understanding of the relationship between art and pornography in this grounded manner.

Most of the essays instead take positions on, or otherwise orient themselves in relation to, a prominent recent expression of the incompatibility of erotic art and pornography by Levinson, which does not address this aspect of pornography. Roughly, here the operative difference between them is that erotic art is intended to induce "sexual thoughts, feelings, imaginings, or desires that would generally be regarded as pleasant in themselves," whereas pornography does the same except that, in addition, it aims to induce "the physiological state that is prelude and prerequisite to sexual release". Erotic art stops short of the latter because erotic art has aesthetic features or matters of form to which it draws its audience's attention, thus interrupting this path to "sexual release." That is, erotic art calls its recipient to step back from the content of the representation to take interest in the medium employed to convey it, such as the type of brushstrokes, perspective, or poetic language. Pornography, in contrast, does not have features that would serve aesthetically to interrupt its end of "sexual release" and instead "present[s] the object for sexual fantasy vividly, and then, as it were, get[s] out of the way" (p. 256, Kania quoting Levinson). As Andrew Kania, one of the contributors, notes, the ways that most aestheticians (and metaphysicians) today understand and inquire about pornography is quite different from how most feminists do.

Section I, "Pornography, Erotica, and Art", addresses this governing manner of differentiating pornography and art most directly. Section II, "Pornography, Imagination, and Fiction", turns on whether pornography that is characterized by fictionalized or imaginative features as compared with more transparent pornography triggers sufficient pause for aesthetic consideration, thus possibly blurring the line between art and pornography to include, as art, some of what is usually considered pornography. In section III, "Pornography, Medium, and Genre", exploration continues along the lines of this distinction but in genres such as films, photography, and literature.

Although the volume raises many topics for discussion, my focus is on those treated mainly in section IV, "Pornography, Ethics, and Feminism", and includes some consideration of how they illuminate issues in other chapters and vice versa. This section raises the most fundamental questions about the very framework dominating the volume, namely whether aesthetics sheds the best light on the relationship between erotic art and pornography, irrespective of whether one uses aesthetic criteria sharply to demarcate the two or wildly to blur the line between them.

In "Concepts of Pornography: Aesthetics, Feminism, and Methodology", Kania, like many of the other contributors, argues that there is enough overlap between erotic art and pornography to question the traditionally sharp distinction between them. However, for Kania, this is the case not only because there is pornography that meets aesthetic criteria, and there is sexually vivid high art aimed at sexual arousal. Rather, it is also because there is another, usually overlooked, manner of overlap in that the main substance of pornography, the "eroticiz[ation] of women's subordination," has also been "a commonplace in art history," with both contributing to women's oppression (p. 273). He claims further that the role of some erotic art (which he calls "pornographic art") in women's oppression has remained even more hidden than pornography's role in it. The reason is that art's high cultural status shields it from such scrutiny, a condition to which the governing aesthetic approach to the subject contributes insofar as it "encourages or maintains the overlooking of this kind of representation" (p. 273), namely its subordinating content.

A proposal in Maes's "Who Says Pornography Can't Be Art?" might contribute to illuminating these usually concealed connections to which Kania draws our attention. Maessuggests more open inquiry into the "pornographic pedigree" of erotic artists, that is, their inspiration and influence by "the pornography that was available in their day and which they often tried to imitate or emulate" (p. 40). We might thereby more fully and accurately appreciate their works, especially the extent to which they mirror rather than fundamentally question or disclose new truth about their world.

A. W. Eaton ("What's Wrong with the (Female) Nude? A Feminist Perspective on Art and Pornography") moves beyond the dominant aesthetic distinction between art and pornography to explain the connection between erotic art, as manifested in European painting's paradigmatic expression, the female nude, and women's inequality. She brings complex feminist theory and philosophy to art theory, criticism, and history to yield the most rigorous, methodical, and grounded work on the subject of which I am aware, in an essay sure to become a classic.

Eaton elaborates an idea developed by MacKinnon (but also with historical antecedents) about how sexual desire, tastes, and standards have been shaped in ways that render women's subordination and men's dominance sexy, a phenomenon that significantly sustains sex inequality, with the female nude an important source of that phenomenon. Using recent delineations of sexual objectification by Martha Nussbaum and Rae Langton, Eaton then very methodically shows how these facets map onto the content of canonical European paintings of the female nude. Some of the patterns she shows include rape and physical destruction presented as sexually attractive, gratuitous inclusion of many women in poses of sexual vulnerability, passivity, violability, and availability, scenarios of surveillance of women in these conditions, and foregrounding of erogenous zones (in an intact body or partial one) in ways that emphasize vulnerability and maximal visual access while minimizing or removing traces of subjectivity. Eaton connects the sexual objectification of women in these paintings to the sexual objectification of women in general by noting that the female nude is almost always presented as both generic and idealized, and furthermore such presentation is systematic, repeated, and pervasive in much of Western art. Her insight that to imagine men presented in these ways "would seem so foreign as to border on the absurd" (p. 304) does, nevertheless, suggest that it is possible that we might one day see such presentations of women in that light too.

Elisabeth Schellekens's "Taking a Moral Perspective on Voyeurism in Art" helps us get a sense of the harms associated with some of the postures that Eaton's analysis of canonical paintings details. Schellekens does so by inviting us to consider similar postures in contemporary non-artistic settings that are starting to be treated as violations of privacy, especially in legal developments surrounding video voyeurism. An example she cites concerns male coworkers spying on female colleagues showering in locker rooms, where among the documented harms are feelings of humiliation and personal degradation and long term effects on the ability to sleep, work, and concentrate (p. 319), in sum, classic signs of post-traumatic stress.

Because of Eaton's grounded understanding of the principal subordinating content of Western erotic art, she is able to revisit aesthetics' relation to art and pornography on a new level that broaches frontiers for productive dialogue, especially vis-à-vis Levinson's separation of them, as she too suggests a fundamental distinction between them. While she recognizes that some of the "gems of the Western canon" (p. 308) and most pornography actively promote women's inequality by (at the very least) eroticizing it, she claims that these gems are distinguished from mainstream pornography in that they furthermore aestheticize women's inequality, which is not usually the case with mainstream pornography. That is, because great art demands our attention to its undeniably dazzling skill, creativity, or beauty, it distinctively minimizes the gravity of its subordinating message and effects and thereby promotes them in an especially powerful way.

"Aestheticization" is a term one often encounters in critical treatment of representations of atrocity, for instance, of the Holocaust in film, poetry, or novels in which aesthetics works against ethical responsibility towards the subject matter.[6] While the domain here is very different from the one that Eaton treats, this philosophical literature is relevant to helping us think about the relationship between pornography and art for which her work may be a bridge.

Michael Newall ("An Aesthetics of Transgressive Pornography") examines affects such as humor, awe, and disgust (mainly eroticized) to which literary pornography by the Marquis de Sade, Georges Bataille, and others delivers many of its readers. His essay seems an example of aestheticization and would benefit from some consideration of feminist analyses of these writers' works, including of the psychology underlying their so-called norm-breaking.[7] That way, there might be greater appreciation of the predictably gendered content, and thus significant uniformity, of the large variety of "transgressive" motifs that Newall treats, such as all manner of rape, including ethnic rape, and sexualized tortures, killings, and mutilations -- scenarios that are like the many testimonies I heard from survivors of the rape-death camps of the Bosnian genocide -- and their connections to the statistically common sexual violations of women in everyday life. There might also be appreciation of the fact that Sade actually committed some of these atrocities and of the absence here of the most transgressive scenario of all, namely treating women as human beings.

If we consider the dominant aesthetic approach and erotic art's distinctive aestheticization of harms as modes of interference with the ethical demand that their main subject matter places on us, then we may connect these modes with another one raised by Christy Mag Uidhir and Henry John Pratt in "Pornography at the Edge: Depiction, Fiction, and Sexual Predilection". In their analysis of comic book forms of pornography, they note that these more effectively erase the individual particularities of the people depicted in scenarios, for instance, of incest, bestiality, and "tentacle rape" than does much more realistic photographic pornography (p. 143). A result is that the consumer has a greater moral distance from and lesser identification with the people depicted, which suggests that this comic book genre might therefore be able to lure even more consumers into participating in this phenomenon than mainstream pornography does. This is a significant insight even though the authors' main point is to make the case for treating these comic book representations as pornography instead of as art on Levinson's distinction between them, as this comic book genre arguably delivers sexual arousal more effectively than does more realistic pornography.

Maes and Levinson's volume is important in orienting philosophers of art to contribute to reflection on pornography, which, as Kania notes, can occur if they take seriously the feminist work on it. On this point, the contributors fall within a wide range, from little or no awareness of such issues to remarkable insights informed by them and some positions in between. Thinking about this range in a neo-Hegelian way gives us some perspective on it. Hegel noted that awareness and developments concerning human oppression first take place in the world and in more immediate areas of inquiry before they percolate to affect philosophy's treatment of it in a process that is long and ongoing,[8] if indeed it ever happens. This collection is part of a significant beginning of this process in the philosophy of art, especially the volume's end, which points to how future needed treatments might begin.

[1] In philosophy, see the pioneering work of Rae Langton, Sexual Solipsism: Philosophical Essays on Pornography and Objectification (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009).

[2] Catharine A. MacKinnon, "The Roar on the Other Side of Silence," Introduction to In Harms WayThe Pornography Civil Rights Proceedings, eds. Catharine A. MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998), 23.

[3] MacKinnon and Dworkin eds., In Harm's Way, 428-429; cf. Christopher N. Kendall, Gay Male Pornography: An Issue of Sex Discrimination (Vancouver: University of British Columbia Press, 2004).

[4] Gail Dines, Pornland: How Porn Has Hijacked Our Sexuality (Boston: Beacon, 2010).

[5] MacKinnon, "The Roar on the Other Side of Silence," Introduction to In Harms Way, eds. MacKinnon and Dworkin, 16-17.

[6] Theodor W. Adorno, Negative Dialectics (New York: The Continuum International Publishing Co., 1973).

[7] Cf. Andrea Dworkin's chapter "The Marquis de Sade (1740-1814)" and her analysis of works by Georges Bataille in Andrea Dworkin, Pornography (New York: Perigee Books, 1981), respectively at 70-100 and 167-178; Catharine A. MacKinnon, "Sexuality" in Toward a Feminist Theory of the State (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1989), 126-154.

[8] G.W.F. Hegel, Lectures on the Philosophy of World History: Introduction, trans. H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975).