Art and Responsibility: A Phenomenology of the Diverging Paths of Rosenzweig and Heidegger

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Jules Simon, Art and Responsibility: A Phenomenology of the Diverging Paths of Rosenzweig and Heidegger, Continuum, 2011, 290pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441109521.

Reviewed by Sol Goldberg, University of Toronto


That Franz Rosenzweig and Martin Heidegger should be compared philosophically is not obvious, but neither is it surprising that the comparison would be attempted. While not a refutation, Jules Simon's new book is clearly a reaction to Peter Gordon's Rosenzweig and Heidegger: Between Judaism and German Philosophy (University of California Press, 2005), whose comparison of the two thinkers in the context of Weimar culture was well received by intellectual historians but left many philosophers unsatisfied. The success of Simon's philosophical comparison thus depends on whether it demonstrates that a significant philosophical problem rather than an intellectual milieu is illuminated by setting Rosenzweig's and Heidegger's respective writings side by side, or -- put in more practical terms -- that Rosenzweig scholars should pay greater attention to Heidegger's work and Heidegger scholars to Rosenzweig's work than each group otherwise might. This is a tall order. Rosenzweig scholars are prone to summarily dismiss Heidegger as a Nazi, while Heidegger scholars are likely to simply disregard Rosenzweig as a theologian. Simon's book won't change this situation, I regret to say, but something can be learned from both the insights and the shortcomings of his effort.

Given the title of Simon's book, one would expect the philosophy of art to be the point of comparison between Rosenzweig and Heidegger. It isn't, or at least not in a widely recognizable sense. Simon uses "philosophy of art" so idiosyncratically that he seems to include within its purview not only aesthetics, poetic language, and narrative structures, but also ethics, politics, and messianism. He thus speaks interchangeably of his "case for . . . the connection between aesthetics and ethics as a way to clearly distinguish the divergent agendas of these two philosophers" (257), his "thesis about the divergence of Heidegger and Rosenzweig with respect to . . . their respective political orientation[s]" (260), and his contrast between "Heidegger's last stand [the posthumously published Der Spiegel interview]" and "an ethical result of Rosenzweig's philosophy of art, namely, that art entails an ethical dimension precisely in how it takes shape as a performative messianic aesthetic that has political consequences" (261). In fact, so little is "philosophy of art" in its familiar sense Simon's concern that he mentions only once (and in passing) that Rosenzweig frequently comments in his correspondences and shorter writings on developments in modern European painting, even though these comments might have been compared instructively to Heidegger's famous discussion of Van Gogh. Simon instead compares Rosenzweig's and Heidegger's philosophies in their overall tendencies, arguing that in each case a philosophy of art plays a leading role.

More specifically, Simon claims that a particular philosophy of art shapes the project of Rosenzweig's Star of Redemption, while Heidegger's philosophical orientation comes to revolve ever increasingly around a philosophy of art first discernible in Being and Time but only completed decades later in his studies of Hölderlin's poetry. This claim dictates the structure of Simon's book, which consists of seven chapters as well as an introduction and a brief conclusion. The first four chapters are devoted to Rosenzweig's Star, whose first part Simon interprets in chapters 1 and 2 and whose other two parts he discusses in chapters 3 and 4, respectively. These chapters are held together by Simon's interpretation of the Star as the paradigmatic artwork in Rosenzweig's own philosophy of art, a philosophy of art performed aesthetically in the narrative philosophizing of Rosenzweig's magnum opus. The three chapters on Heidegger, by contrast, trace the development of a view that begins with an analysis of tool-being and inauthenticity of Being and Time, continues through a more precise determination of the ontology of art and its individuating effect in "Origin of the Work of Art," and arrives at a project in which great works of poetry found the existential direction not only of individuals but also of the German nation.

This layout of the argument is among the serious limitations of Simon's book. By deciding to keep his discussions of Rosenzweig and Heidegger largely discrete from one another, Simon fails to provide the sort of Auseinandersetzung characteristic of the best philosophical comparisons. The decision appears even more questionable, however, in light of his claim that significant parallels between Rosenzweig and Heidegger are to be found not only in their overall projects, but also in the distinct phases of these projects. According to Simon,

Heidegger's three works roughly correspond to the three parts of Rosenzweig's Star: Part I of The Star to Heidegger's Being and Time (oriented towards phenomenologies of knowledge); Part II of The Star to Heidegger's The Origin of the Work of Art (both focused on phenomenologies of aesthetics); and finally, Rosenzweig's Part III of The Star to Heidegger's interpretations of Hölderlin's poetry, with their respective ethical and political implications (225).

These parallels do not -- could not -- come clearly to the fore in Simon's mutually isolated interpretations of Rosenzweig and Heidegger, and the very suggestion in the final chapter that they exist is surprising. Although Simon asserts that "reading Heidegger with others is so important, especially with an other such as Rosenzweig, a contemporary whose aesthetics has an ethical impulse that leads us . . . toward receiving an other as other" (245), his book reads Heidegger after -- rather than with -- Rosenzweig.

The sequence, nevertheless, could not be revised without fundamentally changing the gist of Simon's argument. Heidegger is read not simply after, but also in terms of Rosenzweig. Simon's benchmark for what a philosophy of art ought to do comes entirely out of his interpretation of Rosenzweig, which then supplies the basis for claiming that Heidegger's philosophy of art is deficient. Already in the "Introduction" Simon makes the odd suggestion that Rosenzweig's response to contemporary political events

took form with his textual construction of a multi-dimensional object of art, which also refers to a natural object -- a star: the Magen David -- that, even more significantly, also stands for the evolving cultural and thus historical formations of specific communities -- Jewish, Christian, and Muslim -- set in terms of their dynamic relationships with each other and other peoples of the world (11),

whereas "Heidegger has no such figure at his disposal" because he "chose to focus primarily on interpreting the poetry of Hölderlin as the quintessential German expression of the impulse towards polis and self-identity" (11). Simon clearly considers the absence of something like the star of David a major deficiency in Heidegger's philosophy of art, but he explains neither why Heidegger could not have made use of the image, nor why he ought to have done so.

Then again, perhaps even more useful than a justification for why Heidegger ought to have developed a Rosenzweigian philosophy of art would have been an explanation of how Heidegger could have developed the philosophy of art that Simon attributes to him. Insofar as Simon is correct that Heidegger endorses both an authoritarian politics and an isolated, disillusioned waiting for salvation, his philosophy of art not only lacks the openness to genuine difference and community that Rosenzweig's offers, but even looks flat-out undesirable ethically and politically. Heidegger's philosophy of art, approached by Simon from the perspective of Rosenzweig's philosophy, thus comes off at best as amoral in its intent and at worst as immoral in its implication. But why would Heidegger hold this view, and, if he does, then why would philosophers take it seriously? The fix is in against Heidegger from the outset of Simon's book.

So, despite its subtitle, Simon's book in no sense concerns "the diverging paths of Rosenzweig and Heidegger" (let alone explains this divergence phenomenologically, whatever that might mean in this context). The metaphor of "diverging paths" suggests that two travellers begin but do not end on one and the same path, that they go some distance together before parting company, that they proceed along common ground at least up to a certain point. Simon never establishes that common ground, unless we are to accept that any philosophy of art which has some political significance is supposed to count as enough of a common basis for a philosophical comparison.

Simon reads Heidegger so unsympathetically that his overall effort at a philosophical comparison is undermined. In other words, the positions of both philosophers in Simon's study suffer as a result of his failure to justify his own philosophical preferences. Because Heidegger's philosophy of art is on the hook for so much politically, Rosenzweig's is held accountable for too little philosophically. This weakness could have been turned into a strength, however, if Simon had taken Heidegger's philosophy of art as a challenge to which Rosenzweig needed to respond rather than the disagreeable voice in a dialogue that takes place exclusively on Rosenzweig's terms. While several details of Simon's interpretation of Heidegger are dubious, his general point that from Being and Time onward Heidegger highlights the need for personal individuation from inauthentic communal norms is plausible hermeneutically and even defensible philosophically. Had Simon taken this position as his starting point, his philosophical task would have changed from asserting the superiority of an ethically-inflected messianic aesthetics over a politically abhorrent philosophy of art to defending the view that art can establish and maintain a faith community against the claim that public art prevents individuality and promotes inauthenticity.

As it stands, the first half of Simon's book should still prove useful for readers interested in understanding The Star of Redemption as an exemplary ethical artwork (though readers would have benefitted further still if this account engaged more extensively than it does the alternative readings of The Star proposed recently by Peter Gordon and Benjamin Pollock). The second half of his book will appeal to those who want confirmation that Heidegger's Nazism affects his philosophy or that he never came close to anything like a Levinasian ethics. But it is hard to see the appeal of Simon's book to the larger field of Heidegger studies or its potential influence on scholars who work on either Rosenzweig or Heidegger: the former will continue to appear as a curious theologian, the later an unrepentant and irredeemable Nazi. And so, whether philosophical confrontation between Rosenzweig and Heidegger is valuable remains an open question, but perhaps how that confrontation should be staged is now a little clearer.