Art and Truth after Plato

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Tom Rockmore, Art and Truth after Plato, University of Chicago Press2013, 335pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226040028.

Reviewed by Gordon Graham, Princeton Theological Seminary


The purpose of this book, we are told right at the start, is to address anew 'the old question, often neglected in contemporary aesthetic debates, about art and truth, or art and cognition' (p. 1). This theme, Tom Rockmore says, is 'now rarely examined' because the questions it raises are wrongly supposed to have been answered long ago. That 'long ago' begins with Plato's downgrading of art as a kind of pseudo-philosophy that can never serve as a genuine vehicle of truth. But, Rockmore contends, 'taken as a whole the later Western aesthetic tradition' can be seen to be 'an ongoing effort to formulate a successful anti-Platonic analysis of art and art objects of the most varied kinds' (p. 1). His purpose is to survey these varied responses, trace their development and adjudicate among them. In doing so he ranges very widely, and considers many writers who get scant attention nowadays, devoting a whole chapter to 'Marx, Marxism, and Aesthetic Realism', for instance.

His opening chapter sets out Plato's contentions about art and truth, and draws not just on the Republic, but on Ion, Cratylus and Sophist. The key concept is mimesis -- imitation/representation. Artistic mimesis, on the Platonic view, is confined to copying appearances and, accordingly, incapable of grasping reality. Obviously such a view rests heavily on an appearance/reality distinction, and in Plato's case that means the Theory of Forms. The second chapter thus takes up, and is principally concerned with, Aristotle's criticisms of the Forms. Interestingly, though, in this chapter Rockmore also considers Plato's Parmenides as no less rich a source of critical probing of the Forms. He finds more positive material, however, in Aristotle's rather different account of mimesis by which art 'imitates' life in the construction of universal 'facts'. In this way, some element of cognition re-enters aesthetics.

The story then leaps forward in time to the 'Middle Ages', by which Rockmore understands the period 500-1500 CE, roughly. This very lengthy period is one dominated by Christian theology's encounter with Greek philosophy, first in Plato, then in Aristotle. Augustine is the chief Platonist, Aquinas the leading Aristotelian, but many other figures make their appearance also. In this confluence of thought there is a 'substitution of religious faith for reason' (p. 75), and hence theology subjugates philosophy. This is the message that Rockmore draws from Aquinas's characterization of philosophy as ancilla theologiae -- the handmaid of theology. As a result, it is unclear whether there can be said to be anything properly called 'medieval aesthetics' since that implies some measure of independent philosophical inquiry. Rockmore does employ the term, but he usually qualifies it with some such expression as 'supposing there is an aesthetics during this period' (p. 92). In any event, though the chapter on 'Christian Platonic and Anti-Platonic Art' is not noticeably shorter than the others, it does not have a key role in the philosophical trajectory that Rockmore is tracing.

Another leap in time brings us to Kant and the 18th century more broadly. This is the century, it has been quite widely held, in which philosophical aesthetics was born. Rockmore accepts that the term 'aesthetics' was indeed coined at this time (by Alexander Baumgarten), but he regards the broader contention as false. Indeed, it is a key part of his theme that philosophical aesthetics has ancient roots. Furthermore, though he acknowledges the great and lasting influence of Kant's third Critique, he does not attribute much success to it in the endeavor in which he is primarily interested. This is partly because Kant writes so obscurely; it is difficult to be sure just what he means to say. It is also because 'in failing to detect the historical character of interpretation Kant remains consistent with his view of knowledge as unchanging while failing to grasp the interpretive dimension in cognitive claims' (p. 145).

As this reference to historicism might lead us to expect, the next chapter is devoted to 'Hegel on Art and Spiritual Truth'. Hegel, it turns out, has the most satisfactory account of truth in art, but there is of course the problem that his philosophy seems to predict/affirm the 'end of art', to be followed by its replacement as a vehicle of Spirit, first by religion and then by philosophy. Rockmore explores this idea not just in Hegel, but also in its best known 20th century advocate, Arthur Danto. Neither Hegel nor Danto, according to Rockmore, truly meant that art was at an end. If they had, it would have been a foolish and easily refuted contention since artists, obviously, have gone on producing art. Rather, and for somewhat different reasons, Hegel and Danto meant to point to the inescapable historically contextualized nature of art, which necessarily reflects the culture and society of which it is a product.

How is such a seemingly relativist claim to be made compatible with the idea that art is a source of truth? Rockmore's response to this question takes us on a rather long and unusual excursion through Marxist aesthetics. He begins with Marx, who by his account was not a materialist but an idealist (of sorts). It is Engels who saddles Marxism with 'naive realism', and thus opens the door to 'a reductionist reading of Marx's economic contextualism, which depends on his seminal distinction between superstructure and base' (p. 216). Marxist aesthetics, contra Marx himself, thus becomes 'anticontextualist', but not 'textualist' after the fashion of the New Critics or in the 'caricatural form' textualism takes in the hands of 'Derrida and other French postmodernists' (p. 216). The valiant efforts of Georg Lukács to rescue Marxist aesthetics by way of 'socialist realism' are unsuccessful, and so we return to Hegel's Idealism. After a survey of 'Theory and Practice of Representation in the Twentieth Century', Rockmore concludes as follows.

Hegel teaches us that, despite Plato's condemnation of art as imitation, there is truth in art, which is one of the salient ways in which we comprehend ourselves according to the criteria that obtain in a given historical moment. The social function of art lies in presenting spirit to itself in an important social form of self-consciousness. (p. 273)

This is a hugely ambitious book, and the range of reading that has gone into its making cannot but be impressive, though the steady flow of many lengthy summaries and brief references to a huge number of writers makes for rather heavy going on the part of the reader. Overall, however, the book seems to me much more importantly flawed, and in a number of critical ways. To begin with, it sets itself to renew a topic that is said to be 'often neglected in contemporary aesthetics debates'. No real evidence is offered of this neglect, and indeed the book is remarkable for making virtually no reference to contemporary work in aesthetics. Yet, even the briefest survey would show, I think, that 'aesthetic cognitivism', as it is increasingly referred to, is not only widely discussed, but alive and well. Indeed, it is a major theme of Paul Guyer's recent, monumental three volume history of aesthetics that philosophical aesthetics has been marked by a constant inclination to press art into the service of knowledge, an inclination that Guyer believes must be strenuously resisted by anyone who recognizes the true nature and value of art.

Rockmore might object to this comparison since he explicitly claims that his book 'is not intended as a history of aesthetics, even in outline. It is rather a systematic inquiry' (p. 6). Viewed in this light, however, it does not come out very well. There are conspicuous failures to address systematic questions that are crucial to his central contentions. For example, he uses the expressions 'art and truth' and 'art and cognition' more or less interchangeably. But the conflation of 'truth' and 'cognition' confounds many of the issues he want to discuss, because there are important dimensions to cognition other than truth. The claim that art is productive of knowledge is much less plausible (to my mind) than the claim that artworks can enrich human understanding. We also need some systematic examination of the differences and relationship between 'art' and 'beauty', and hence between 'philosophical aesthetics', the 'philosophy of beauty' and 'philosophy of the arts'. It is only the absence of such an examination that allows Rockmore to assert several times, and with little argument, that 'aesthetics' did not begin in the 18th century but with the ancient Greek philosophers. Similarly, the scope of his thesis is constantly in doubt because he does not systematically relate and differentiate the varieties of art. Often it seems that he is thinking primarily of painting, sometimes of poetry and drama, rarely of music or architecture. But his claims about, for instance, the Christian 'artists' of the 'Middle Ages' would be hard to relate to musicians, partly because he does not seem to appreciate that 'music' as one of the seven 'liberal arts' had very little to do with studying the composition and performance of music as this is understood today.

Insofar as the book is intended to bring history to bear on philosophical issues it does not score very highly either. There are, as it seems to me, serious methodological weaknesses that undermine some of its claims. For instance, on page 57 we are told that Aristotle's poetics 'was apparently not influential during ancient times', but ten pages later we are told that 'Aristotle's reaction to Plato . . . brings about a sea change in aesthetics'. These two claims could in principle be made to cohere with each other, but only if Aristotle's ideas are removed completely from their historical context and considered simply for their cogency as ideas. This seems at odds, though, with the social and historical contextualism that Rockmore in the end wants to endorse. More significantly, much of his historical treatment relies on extremely broad generalizations that would not be borne out by more careful investigation. His account of the relationship between theology and philosophy in the 'Middle Ages' is said to cover a period of one thousand years. It does not take much historical sensitivity to suppose that overgeneralizing is not merely a risk, but a certainty here. And indeed it is true that his account of this period -- faith suppressing reason -- is simply a slightly sophisticated version of what most people recognize to be a caricature.

It is no pleasure to give a serious and substantial philosophical work such a low rating. So on the positive side I think it can safely be said that readers will undoubtedly benefit from Rockmore's range of reference. Every chapter alerts us to writers of whom contemporary philosophers know little, but who sound as though they are worth examining more closely. We can be grateful to Rockmore's book for performing this valuable service. Unhappily, and despite this merit, it does not throw much valuable light on the philosophical issues with which contemporary aesthetics is concerned.