Art, Emotion and Ethics

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Berys Gaut, Art, Emotion and Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2007, 269pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199263213.

Reviewed by Daniel Jacobson, Bowling Green State University


Berys Gaut's new book offers an extended argument for moralism about art: roughly, the thesis that the intrinsic moral flaws of an artwork count as aesthetic flaws, and its moral merits as aesthetic merits. The recent debate over moralism in the philosophy of art has generated some unfortunate terminological and taxonomic confusion. Gaut navigates this morass deftly, homing in on what is at issue between moralism and its two competitors: autonomism and an anti-theoretical view sometimes misleadingly termed immoralism.[1] Autonomism holds that the moral qualities and defects of artworks are never aesthetically relevant. The anti-theoretical view holds that although the moral qualities of art are sometimes aesthetically relevant (contra autonomism), its morally dubious features can be among its aesthetic merits and its morally salutary features among its aesthetic flaws (contra moralism).[2]

Gaut terms his particular version of the moralist theory, the central thesis of which is formulated in terms of pro tanto principles of invariant valence but disparate strength, ethicism. As he describes the view,

Ethicism holds that a work is aesthetically flawed in so far as it possesses an aesthetically relevant ethical flaw and aesthetically meritorious in so far as it possesses an aesthetically relevant ethical merit. The ethical flaws referred to are intrinsic ethical flaws, not the ethically bad effects that works may have on actual audiences. Intrinsic ethical flaws are ethical flaws in the attitudes that works manifest toward their subjects. (229)

The first point to notice about this pro tanto formulation, which Gaut here expresses with the phrase "in so far as," is that it makes no claims about the strength of this putatively invariant association between moral and aesthetic value. This flexibility allows Gaut to grant that some morally dubious works are aesthetic triumphs, only minimally tainted by their moral failings; and he can also accept what seems even more obvious, that some morally praiseworthy works are nevertheless aesthetic disasters. In fact, Gaut touts as a virtue of ethicism its ability to hold that in some cases any possible improvement of a work's moral features might diminish it aesthetically on the whole. While such extreme flexibility buffers the theory from counterexample, I will suggest that this ultimately proves double-edged.

Gaut offers three distinct but mutually supportive arguments for his theory: an argument from moral beauty, which claims that the intrinsic moral qualities of artworks are literally forms of beauty and ugliness; an appeal to cognitivism about art, the view that a central aesthetic merit of art lies in its ability to teach us, especially about morality; and what he calls the merited response argument, which focuses on the propriety of the attitudes manifested in artworks. Together these arguments are claimed to render ethicism nothing less than "inescapable" and "unavoidable" (252).

While I remain unpersuaded, there is much here to admire. Among the strengths of the work are the clarity and sophistication of Gaut's arguments, as well as his detailed and thoughtful -- though sometimes tendentious -- use of examples drawn from literature and painting. Despite my misgivings, I consider this an important book that deserves to be widely read and discussed, albeit more for its positive development of moralism, which is the best and most thorough treatment extant, than for its discussion of objections and opposing theories.

In what follows, I will use each of the first two arguments to illustrate crucial and problematic features of Gaut's view, and then focus briefly on the final and most important of his arguments. Consider first the argument from moral beauty, which claims that in art, as in life, "moral virtues are beautiful, moral vices are ugly" (115). Similarly, Gaut suggests, the virtuous or vicious character of the work's "manifested artist" contributes to its beauty or ugliness, respectively. Since beauty is the paradigm aesthetic merit in art, it would follow that the moral character of a work counts among its aesthetic merits or defects. But I am not convinced that to call someone's character morally beautiful is anything more than to express one's approval of it, which need not have any aesthetic purport. For this argument to support ethicism, virtues and vices must literally be marks of beauty and ugliness. This claim flirts with reductio via Scarlett Johansson (or, if you prefer, Tom Brady): the observation that the beauty of Johansson or Brady is quite settled by the overt visual evidence – it does not await any judgment of their character. Yet Gaut takes care to construct ethicism so as to be compatible with their manifest beauty. This discussion thus serves primarily to illustrate the weakness of the claim central to Gaut's version of the moralism, and to explain why he needs to adopt such a weak thesis.

According to ethicism, the beauty of Johansson and Brady would be marred insofar as they possess some character flaw. One might take this to imply that, were they extremely vicious, these two would then be rendered ugly by their vice -- which leads to the reductio. But that isn't how Gaut glosses the "insofar as" language of ethicism. He dismisses seeming counterexamples by granting that the aesthetic significance of even serious moral defects might be so small as to be overwhelmed by other aesthetic qualities. Moreover, he allows that in some cases what is morally dubious about an artwork is incorrigible, because it is inextricably bound up with features essential to the work's aesthetic value. Even if the argument from moral beauty succeeds, such incorrigible works could not be made aesthetically better by their moral improvement. Gaut goes further still:

Even if moral beauty always undermined some other aesthetic merits, there would be no ground for claiming that the moral beauty is not intrinsically an aesthetic merit. For such a scenario would merely show that there is, as it were, a tragic conflict between aesthetic merits. (131)

But this seems to me both overstated and ad hoc; indeed, it threatens to make the view impossible to falsify. Surely the more examples we find of works whose morally dubious properties figure incorrigibly in their aesthetic excellence, the stronger grounds we have to reject moralism altogether -- notwithstanding the heroic possibility of saving ethicism by positing tragic conflicts of aesthetic value.

Consider next the argument from aesthetic cognitivism: the view that a central aesthetic virtue of at least some artworks lies in what they can teach us, especially about morality. The cognitivist claim that instruction can be a central aesthetic value in art is deeply controversial, but let us grant it both for the sake of argument and because it is held in common between contemporary moralists and anti-theorists. The crucial and problematic step in Gaut's argument lies in his dictum that cognitivism implies ethicism because "one cannot (successfully) teach someone something false" (185); hence, only a morally true artwork can teach us about morality. Issues of truth aptness are not pertinent here, since this conclusion can be taken in a deflationary sense. Rather, the point is that this dictum makes the truth of a work's moral stance always both a moral and an aesthetic merit, and its falsity both a moral and an aesthetic defect, which leads directly to ethicism. Gaut's formulation of cognitivism is tendentious, however, and other formulations do not entail his moralist conclusion. Very briefly, one can hold instead that works of narrative art show us, even teach us, something more like how things look from a given ethical perspective.[3] Indeed, art is especially well suited to provide this kind of knowledge by acquaintance precisely because it so effective at arousing the emotional responses characteristic of an ethical perspective: that is, a "take" on the evaluative landscape. Emotionally laden acquaintance with what it's like to see (and feel) things in novel ways seems central to our core concerns for narrative art. Thus it is hard to deny the aesthetic relevance of such imaginative and affective engagement with artworks.

Nevertheless -- and this is the crucial point -- this sort of knowledge does not require the relevant perspective to be true or virtuous. A work can teach us how things look and feel from vicious or false perspectives as well.  Indeed, many artworks seem profoundly engaging precisely for their success at making vivid alien and suspect ethical perspectives.[4] These will be the cases most challenging to ethicism: intrinsically immoral art that seems aesthetically excellent for just the same reason that it's morally dubious. I think Gaut fails to confront the most powerful cases by dint of selective examples and tendentious interpretation. Despite attempts to buffer ethicism against counterexample, Gaut sometimes overreaches in his attempt to interpret works in a morally flattering light. He does this primarily by appealing to what he calls the seduction strategy, which acquits works of vice by finding in them an overarching moralizer who seduces the reader into sympathy with vice only to scold him, ultimately, by demonstrating his moral error. Although this is a familiar authorial strategy, so are contrary tactics that Gaut doesn't consider. A currently popular example might be called the ironic strategy, which allows the author to say something dubious while maintaining the ability to take it back, should that prove expedient, by claiming to be speaking ironically. Gaut appeals to the seduction strategy as an almost ubiquitous way to vindicate those morally suspect works he considers, and some of these interpretations I find strained.

Gaut's formulation of cognitivism also gets him into avoidable epistemological trouble due to its need to find moral truth in aesthetic experience. Consider his primary example of something that can be learned by engagement with art, the single case he returns to repeatedly without considering its difficulties. Through literature, he suggests:

I can meditate on whether there ought to be free universal healthcare by imagining myself to be poor and ill in a society without such a system, and seeing whether I can endorse what would happen to me. (145)

By bringing the reader to empathize with the plight of someone poor and ill in a society without free universal healthcare, Gaut claims, a work of art can demonstrate the injustice of such a system. This purely imaginative and empathic test, he expressly notes, "employs imagination and requires no direct empirical confirmation" (157, fn27) in order to land its conclusion. I want to suggest that this approach is fundamentally misguided because the consequences of any such policy are exactly what should be at issue. But in order to evaluate my argument, the reader must put aside any antecedent views on the merits of free universal healthcare, since the issue at hand concerns not public policy but epistemology: specifically, whether we can discover the justice of any such system through a purely imaginative and empathic process free from messy empirical details.

The empathic and non-empirical method Gaut employs engages the imagination in a severely limited way. For instance, it seems to ignore the pain of someone suffering from a curable disease yet unable to get treatment because of the rationing of health care which, under certain social conditions, would be among the consequences of such a program. Moreover, a central feature of narrative art renders it dangerously misleading precisely for the reasons Gaut takes to be its strength: its appeal to empathic responses unconstrained by reality. Consider how much easier it is to write the story Gaut imagines -- the tragedy of the poor victim condemned by the failure of empathy of the rich and heartless -- than the tedious story of a patient left to die a slow, bureaucratic death on some government waiting list. Thus, although Gaut gets it right about what narrative art does best, namely to engage us in imaginative exercises of feeling another's pain and pleasure, he seems oblivious to the moral and epistemological dangers of its almost demagogic power.

Finally, the merited response argument is Gaut's version of a Humean theme on which several recent aesthetic moralists have offered variations. The core idea trades on the thought that several evaluative properties, including some of the most aesthetically relevant, are response-dependent. Thus funny things are those that merit amusement, shameful things those that merit shame, and so forth. If Aristotle was even partly correct to identify the tragic emotions as fear and pity, then an aesthetically successful tragedy will be one that merits those sentiments (inter alia). The trouble for moralism lies in the fact that the relevant notion of merit needs to be explicated; moreover, there are several distinct respects in which one might approve or disapprove of an emotion as a response to its object. In particular, it might be a morally appropriate response, or it might be a fitting response -- where a response is fitting, by definition, just in case its object has the purported evaluative property: it is funny, shameful, pitiable, and so forth.[5] Or, of course, it may be both morally appropriate and fitting, or even morally appropriate because fitting. (On one imaginable though perhaps not entirely plausible moral view, the fittingness of a response is always morally exculpatory.) What cannot be assumed, however, is that a response is fitting because it is morally appropriate.

This assumption does not hold true even for the narrowly moral emotions, those that are undoubtedly sensitive to morally relevant features of objects and situations, such as guilt and anger. It might always be wrong to get angry -- at any rate, that seems a coherent moral claim -- yet this would not show that nothing is genuinely outrageous, merely that virtue dictates not being outraged even by the outrageous. Considerations about the prudence or the propriety of having a response have come to be called "wrong kinds of reason" in favor of or against an emotional response. Such reasons are of the wrong kind in the sense that though they genuinely count as considerations favoring or against having some response, they do so by pointing to features of being in the state rather than to qualities of its object. Hence they are irrelevant to the question of whether some act is outrageous, a joke funny, and so forth. While this is admittedly difficult terrain, the crucial point can be made quickly and clearly enough. Some considerations that bear on the propriety of having an emotional response to an object do not bear on its fittingness. The simplest cases are those of purely instrumental (or strategic) considerations: get angry at your boss and you can kiss that promotion goodbye. This general point is not limited to strategic reasons, though they will suffice. If we're interested in whether some response is virtuous or vicious we must take all the morally relevant features into account, including the most obviously instrumental, whether or not they bear on the evaluative features of the object at all.

Curiously, Gaut ultimately seems to embrace this conclusion, though I think it fatal to this sort of Humean moralism. He writes:

Imagine a comedy full of hilarious jokes, all of which were so vicious and cruel that audiences watched in stony silence, without being amused at all, since they correctly thought that it would be wrong to feel amusement. Would this count as an aesthetic success? Clearly not: we value art in part because of the responses it properly calls forth, and ex hypothesi the audience of this play is morally cut off from responding from it. (241)

While I genuinely don't know what Gaut means by "aesthetic success" here, one thing is certain (because stipulated): this audience's imagined stony silence notwithstanding, the jokes would be hilarious. One might have thought this the very criterion of distinctively comic success, despite the fact that, in order to achieve popular success, comedians must negotiate delicately between the funny and what they can bring their actual audiences to laugh at. Although Gaut suggests that ethicism can simply narrow its scope so as to ignore vicious but funny humor, the argument generalizes from amusement to other sentimental responses, including all of those attitudes that manifest the ethical perspectives of narrative art. Hence, I remain convinced that ethicism cannot rest content with showing that the aesthetic value of immoral art is morally inaccessible to a sufficiently virtuous audience, on pain of changing the subject.

[1] Gaut refers to this view as contextualism whereas I prefer calling it anti-theoretical, but this is merely a nominal difference. He recognizes the crucial point that in order for moralism to be anything more than the denial of autonomism -- and for it to be incompatible with 'immoralism', as clarity surely requires -- it must be formulated as claiming an invariant positive association between the (relevant) moral and aesthetic qualities of art.

[2] This anti-theoretical view was, to my knowledge, first advanced in my essay, "In Praise of Immoral Art," Philosophical Topics 25 (1997): 155-199.

[3] For development of this view and discussion of the epistemological problems that face formulations of aesthetic cognitivism such as Gaut's, see my essay, "Sir Philip Sidney's Dilemma: On the Ethical Function of Narrative Art," The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 54 (1996): 64-79.

[4] This is the line of thought that runs through both "Sidney's Dilemma" and "In Praise of Immoral Art." It is also developed in Matthew Kieran, "Forbidden Knowledge: the Challenge of Immoralism," in Art and Morality, eds. J. Bermudez and S. Gardner (London: Routledge, 2003).

[5] This is a leading thought of the sentimentalist theory I have been developing collaboratively in a series of articles coauthored with Justin D'Arms. Although Gaut takes me as his principal foil in this section of the book, he does not seem familiar with this work. See in particular Justin D'Arms and Daniel Jacobson, "The Moralistic Fallacy: On the 'Appropriateness' of Emotion," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 61 (2000): 65-90.