Art in Public: Politics, Economics, and a Democratic Culture

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Lambert Zuidervaart, Art in Public: Politics, Economics, and a Democratic Culture, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 338pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521130172.

Reviewed by Larry Shiner, University of Illinois at Springfield


Anyone who has followed the periodic "culture wars" that break out whenever some outraged congressman attacks a piece of government funded art he or she finds offensive and is counter-attacked by an equally outraged critic who defends artists' freedom to do anything they want will find this book a welcome relief. Instead of the usual pieties about our need for high art's "challenges" and "subversions," Zuidervaart offers a philosophically sophisticated reflection that exposes the false assumptions shared by both "traditionalists" and "transgressivists." In the process, I believe, Zuidervaart gets to the heart of the deeper cultural and political issues at stake. The present book is actually a sequel and extension of his earlier work Artistic Truth: Aesthetics, Discourse, and Imaginative Disclosure (Cambridge University Press, 2004), and together the two aim at a general theory of art and its place in society that will break "the grip of modernist aesthetics without discounting the importance of modernist ideas." (ix) Art in Public focuses on social and political theorizing of the arts' role in society as Zuidervaart tries to uncover the often implicit conceptual frameworks that hamper our transcending the familiar oppositions over government funding for the arts.

The book starts off with a critique of three assumptions that both the advocates and opponents of government funding share. The first shared assumption is their framing the issue as a problem of the arts' economic survival, with one side claiming a need for government support and the other arguing for reliance on the market. Here, Zuidervaart says, both advocates and opponents skirt the crucial issue of whether art is a social good whose support is in the public interest. Secondly, both advocates and opponents of government funding share a view of artists as isolated individuals rather than seeing them as participants in art institutions and cultural communities. Finally, both sides accept the modernist idea that art must be in the vanguard, advocates of funding viewing artists as the prophetic figures who goad us toward progress, the opponents viewing artists as a narcissistic and decadent threat. But, as Zuidervaart says, this shared romantic idea of the modern artist as the individual genius and rebel is simply untrue for the vast majority of artists. Similarly, the idea that art is the privileged locus of society's vanguard is grossly exaggerated since many other fields contribute as much or more to foretelling and bringing into being our collective future. Above all, the focus on provocative content by both advocates and opponents of government support overlooks the more important role the arts can play in nurturing a democratic culture. These points, made by Zuidervaart in the first chapter of the book, are in my view one of his most important contributions to helping us break out of the usual clichés used to attack and to defend state support of the arts.

Zuidervaart devotes his next two chapters to a critical examination of current economic and political justifications for government support of the arts, finding most of them inadequate. The problem with most economic justifications, whether they argue from external benefits, from the demands of equity, or even from "merit good" positions, is that all suffer from a "culture deficit," that is, they end up treating the arts more or less as a type of consumer commodity rather than arguing from the idea that art is a sociocultural good. In developing his own version of the social good claim, Zuidervaart relies on positions he developed in Artistic Truth, namely, that the social role of the arts is one of "imaginative disclosure" which provides "cultural orientation" and "meaning" to the members of society, thereby turning the arts into "irreducibly social goods." (44-45) Unfortunately, the crucial concept of "imaginative disclosure" is not given enough exposition here -- Zuidervaart only offers a short summary and several quotes from his earlier work -- so that the reader needs to consult the earlier work to fully grasp his ideas.

Zuidervaart is also critical of most of the political arguments put forward for government funding by John Rawls, Ronald Dworkin, and Joel Feinberg, finding them to suffer from a "democratic deficit," especially by inadequately addressing the justice issue in relation to institutional and community pluralism. His answer to this deficit brings him to his notion of "art in public" (as opposed to "public art," a term that tends to suggest individual works). By art in public, Zuidervaart means art that is directly or indirectly supported by government and whose "meaning is available to a public that goes beyond the art's original audience." (80, 296) Zuidervaart claims that this definition encompasses much of contemporary art and that we can no longer regard art as something which is purely individually produced and consumed; rather we need "a post individualist, non-privatist, and communicative framework." (81)

Zuidervaart builds up his theoretical argument in favor of government support across two major sections of the book. Part II deals with "Civil Society" and sketches his theory of the "public sphere" and the "civic sector," along with the challenges to them posed both by the administrative state and the market economy. Part III, "Modernism Remixed," recalibrates the modernist notions of autonomy, authenticity, and social responsibility. Zuidervaart is a careful expositor and astute critic of the various current theories of the public sphere and the civic sector, along with notions like the "social economy." For those philosophers of art unfamiliar in depth with political and social theory, this section's clear descriptions and nuanced critiques of Dworkin, Jürgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, Seyla Benhabib, Charles Taylor, Jeremy Rifkin, and a host of lesser known figures will alone be worth the price of the book.

Zuidervaart's basic contention is that an adequate understanding of the government funding issue requires a broader and more dialectical conceptual framework than is usually invoked. He begins with the idea that alongside a theory of the state and economy we need a well-developed theory of civil society, especially its leading components, the public sphere -- the place where civil society intersects the state -- and the civic sector -- the place where civil society intersects the proprietary economy. As a realm of public deliberation, the public sphere needs the arts' "imaginative disclosures" to bring attention to "issues and interests that require government response if public justice is to be done." (296) As the realm of nonprofit and nongovernmental organizations, the civic sector plays an enormous, but too often overlooked, economic and political role in contemporary societies, where it is primarily concerned with social solidarity. As such, it is part of what some social theorists call the "social economy," an "economy" whose importance for arts organizations is that it gives them an independence that is crucial to their contribution to human solidarity. In fact, Zuidervaart devotes an entire chapter to what he calls the "countervailing forces" of a globalized marketplace that seeks to commercialize all the arts and an administrative state that tends to bureaucratically limit acceptable art practices.

The final component of Zuidervaart's theoretical framework concerns the basic assumptions of modernism in the arts: autonomy, authenticity, and social responsibility. I have already mentioned his critique of artistic individualism. Beyond filling out that critique in Part III through a sophisticated notion of "relational autonomy" (in its societal, internal, and interpersonal aspects), Zuidervaart also argues that there is a dialectical relationship between authenticity and social responsibility. Of particular interest here is his appreciation of the social responsibility of the art audience -- he goes so far as to speak of an "authentic co-responsibility" of artists and audiences, especially as manifest in what Suzanne Lacy refers to as "new genre public art." (263) These reflections lead Zuidervaart to his penultimate chapter devoted to the need for a "democratic culture," drawing on Dewey's notion that democracy is not just a political system but should pervade all aspects of society, thereby fostering the linked experiences of "participation, recognition, and freedom." (282) The deepest task of art in public, according to Zuidervaart, occurs when it manifests an appropriate "relational autonomy" by helping other civil sector institutions nurture a democratic culture. As Zuidervaart points out, this conception of art in public means that artists can "no longer presume to have a privileged place just by virtue of being artists," but it also means that artists no longer have to "pretend that their contributions are inevitably marginal or misunderstood." (291)

Zuidervaart's final chapter offers an overview of the conceptual framework he has built in the course of the preceding chapters and concludes with an outline of his own "sociocultural justification" for government of funding of the arts. Although he offers a series of five "premises," each broken down into four or five sub-arguments, I believe the gist of his case can be reduced to two broad claims. First, he claims that society needs arts organizations to foster the imaginative disclosures that can illuminate the public sphere and strengthen the social economy of the civic sector for the promotion of solidarity. Second, he claims that since the state has a public justice obligation to assure both a robust public sphere and a vital civic sector, it also has an obligation to support arts organizations that both participate in and contribute to the public sphere and the civic sector (though not necessarily individual artists or particular cultural communities). Zuidervaart recognizes that the justification of direct state subsidies for such purposes requires a separate step in his argument and that there are accompanying perils to direct subsidies, since they can easily infringe on the independence that arts organizations need to do their job of imaginative disclosure. Moreover, he also leaves to a future work the thorny issue of just what form such direct funding might take.

Unfortunately, that thorny issue is crucial to the question of state support for the arts, since it is the enormous variety of the arts, the well nigh intractable problems of elite vs. popular, and the powerful tradition of individual artistic freedom and vanguardism that are precisely the flash points in our culture wars. One would have liked at least a brief indication that there might be a solution to these problems; as it is, Art in Public left me feeling a bit like I had been on a magnificent tour de force of social theory and then it was time to go home to the same old struggles.

Although the book is extremely well organized, the writing clear, and careful conceptual distinctions abound, there are still some problems. I have already mentioned the lack of an adequate exposition of "imaginative disclosure," and I would add that Zuidervaart's particular definition of "Art in Public" (art that is government supported and goes beyond its original audience) did not seem very clear to me. One problem with this -- and with many other definitions and arguments -- is the dearth of concrete examples. Too often, I was left trying to imagine the practical implications of what Zuidervaart was proposing. In the overall scheme of the book's argument these are not fatal flaws. One of the book's great strengths is its comprehensiveness. Zuidervaart recognizes he must build a case that covers the aesthetic, cultural, social, economic, and political dimensions of the issue and shows how the positions he takes on each can be integrated. This will give critics many holds to use in attacking the overall argument.

Although the limitations of Zuidervaart's "sociocultural justification" leave the full case for public funding incomplete, Art in Public accomplishes so much that I am not inclined to further complaints. Zuidervaart has clearly moved the discussion of government funding of the arts to a new plane by carefully canvassing the inadequacies of current theories while drawing on their best points. By tying the justification of state support for the arts to the government's role in promoting public justice and, in particular, to the arts' contribution to the public sphere and to social solidarity via the civic sector, Zuidervaart has made a genuinely original contribution to current debates. Of course, his approach, especially his left-leaning positions on economic and political theory, is not going to convince conservative opponents of government funding. Nor are his criticisms of individualism and vanguardism likely to please many in the contemporary high art community, where the old shibboleths of the sovereignty of the artist and a preference for "transgressive" gestures are still in force. Many artists, curators, critics, and theorists would rather enjoy the frisson of seeing themselves as victims of an uncomprehending and hostile world than grapple reflectively with the complex issue of art's proper role in society. But for those who are looking for a more thoughtful and well grounded consideration of the issue of government funding and, above all, of the appropriate place of the arts in our social and political life, Zuidervaart has given us an indispensible book.