Art in Three Dimensions

Placeholder book cover

Noël Carroll, Art in Three Dimensions, Oxford University Press, 2010, 539 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199559312.

Reviewed by James O. Young, University of Victoria


Over the past two decades Noël Carroll has established himself as one of the most eminent contemporary philosophers of art. This collection brings together many of the essays on which his reputation is based. The book's title alludes not to sculpture but to a theme that unifies these essays: art is and ought to be part of the fabric of our lives and it can only be understood when it is seen in its full social, cultural and biological context. Carroll is opposed to formalism and the suggestion that aesthetic experience is disinterested in the sense of being removed from our everyday concerns. Carroll also believes that a full understanding of the arts requires that we look at the full gamut of artworks: from dance to drama, from opera to soap opera, from painting to moving pictures, from high to popular art. While Carroll is indisputably erudite, he is anything but a snob.

The definition of art is the first topic addressed in this volume. Carroll rejects the suggestion that there is some function shared by all artworks. In particular, the formalist suggestion that all artworks provide a sort of disinterested aesthetic experience comes in for pointed criticism. Carroll's positive account of art is the "narrative approach." On this view, something is a work of art when a narrative links it, via a line of descent, to past works of art. He has, to use Stephen Davies's typology, a procedural definition of art. On Carroll's account, Cage's 4' 33'' and Duchamp's Fountain count as works of art because one can tell a story about how they are descended from previously produced artworks. While Carroll wants to make the class of artworks a big tent that welcomes the new, he stresses the importance of artistic tradition. The artist, he writes, "submerges herself in her tradition, and what she takes from it incubates in ways that enable her to produce new works." (p. 72)

Carroll does not indicate what we should say when a competing narrative argues that some work (such as Fountain) is fundamentally discontinuous with previous art and not art at all. Interestingly, both avant garde artists and derriere garde critics tell such stories. Duchamp and others insisted that they were not producing works of art precisely because they were making a clean break from the past. Yet Carroll is certain that works such as Fountain ought to count as works of art.

In another group of essays, Carroll presents an account of aesthetic experience. He rejects the suggestion that aesthetic experience is a specific sort of pleasurable experience. Not all aesthetic experiences are pleasurable or valued for their own sake. (Think, for example, of how uncomfortable one can feel when watching a good performance of Othello.) Carroll substitutes what he calls a "content oriented" approach to the analysis of aesthetic experience. On this account, aesthetic experience is to be understood "in terms of the kinds of objects toward which it is directed." (p. 101) The objects towards which aesthetic experience is directed are the formal and expressive or aesthetic properties of artworks. Carroll's account of aesthetic experience has the advantage of being able to account for the variety of ways in which the experience of artworks is valuable. As he notes, sometimes artworks are not valued for the pleasure that they afford, but for their ritual use or (as he will later argue) their cognitive value.

Arguably, works of art are most useful as sources of knowledge and Carroll devotes several essays to this possibility. Carroll is particularly concerned to defend the suggestion that art is a source of moral knowledge. He believes that, under the baleful influence of Hutcheson, Kant and (later) Wilde, artists and philosophers have neglected the moral possibilities of art for the past two hundred or so years: "the serious artist through most of this period has not respected moral instruction and exploration as a worthwhile vocation." (p. 161) This is a highly questionable claim from an art historical perspective. Certainly novelists such as Dickens, George Eliot, E.M. Forster, Trollope, Henry James and others have seen themselves as contributing to moral knowledge. Carroll himself identifies some of these writers as contributing to moral knowledge. Even some painters (think of Picasso's Guernica) and filmmakers have been aware of art's moral function. Still, it is fair to say that many philosophers have been skeptical about the cognitive value of art.

Carroll identifies three arguments against the view that art has cognitive value: the banality argument, the no-evidence argument and the no-argument argument. According to the first argument, artworks can only convey banalities. Pride and Prejudice, according to this argument, at best conveys the knowledge that first impressions are a poor guide to character. And everyone already knows such a trivial truth. The other two (closely related) arguments maintain that artworks cannot contribute to knowledge since they cannot provide us with grounds for moral beliefs that it may attempt to convey.

Carroll's response to these arguments turns on his claim that works of art, particularly works of literature, are akin to philosophical thought experiments. Works of art, like thought experiments, "make connections … between what is already known and other parts of our cognitive stock." (p. 210) By making such connections, artworks can provide us with more than banalities and, like thought experiments, artworks can "function as arguments." (p. 213) In one fell swoop, Carroll takes down all three of the opposing arguments: artworks are arguments, they marshal evidence already in our store of beliefs and connections between our beliefs can be important.

I am sympathetic to Carroll's defense of the cognitive value of art, but I wonder about whether works of art provide arguments. An argument is a series of premises designed to establish a conclusion. Artworks do not obviously provide us with premises. Certainly paintings and musical works do not. Even the claim that works of literature contain premises depends on the highly controversial claim that sentences in literary works have non-literal meanings and can be non-literally true. Even if works of art do not function as arguments, they can perform the function of making the sort of connection that Carroll regards as crucial to their having cognitive value. Discourse and argument are not the only sources of evidence and knowledge. Showing is also an important source of knowledge. To show is to put someone in a position to recognize something rather than to give a reason or an argument for the truth. Perhaps works of art ought to be seen as more akin to gestures than to arguments. Artworks could give us ways of looking at things that provide us with insights into them. When Carroll speaks of works of art making connections I think that he is on to something, but it sounds to me that he is talking about artworks showing, rather than artworks providing us with arguments.

A fourth main theme of the book concerns the relationship between art and our affects. Carroll joins a number of other philosophers of art, notably Jenefer Robinson, who are dissatisfied with the cognitive theory of emotions. Some empirical evidence certainly indicates that some affective responses are directly triggered by the amygdala without the input of the cognitive centers of the brain. Arguably, the cognitive theory of the emotions has been an obstacle to understanding the relationship between art and emotion. The theory insists that individuals cannot be in a given affective state without a requisite belief. These beliefs are absent when individuals are experiencing works of art, and so advocates of the cognitive theory have concluded that these individuals cannot be in affective states that they report experiencing. Allowing that artworks can arouse affects (he often talks of moods rather than emotions), Carroll is able to enhance his aesthetic cognitivism. He sees art as able to provide insight into our affects and regards this as capturing Collingwood's suggestion that art clarifies emotions.

The view that art arouses and provides insight into affective states is one thing when it is applied to literature and other representational arts. It is another thing when extended, as Carroll wishes to do, to absolute music. When one applies this view to music, one will arouse the ire of Peter Kivy, and Kivy has criticized Carroll's views on this matter. The empirical evidence increasingly suggests that Carroll is right. In particular, Carroll's view that music arouses affects through its somatic effects is increasingly supported by empirical research. Music is experienced as moving and as inspiring the body to movement. (In an essay on dance, he returns to this theme. Carroll writes that, "some dance is best understood as the clarification or deepening of movement inspired by the music … by activation of the motor reflexes in the body of the spectator." [p. 492]) Kivy continues to resist this conclusion but he looks increasingly irrational. By his own admission, Kivy has not examined the empirical research. Instead, he has restricted his claim that music does not arouse affects to certain kinds of listening and certain kinds of listeners. Kivy's latest position seems to be the empty tautology that music does not arouse affects in those who listen in a way that does not arouse affects.

The twenty-five essays in this book are always insightful, thoughtful and provocative. Every page is informed by deep and wide appreciation of the arts as well as philosophical erudition. The collection is somewhat repetitive and in certain respects a systematic monograph by Carroll might have been desirable. Perhaps, however, a philosophical commonplace book is a better medium for Carroll's thought. He has a particularistic, magpie turn of thought, not unlike that of Wittgenstein, whom he acknowledges as one of his philosophical role models. Whatever one thinks of the form or content of this book, there can be no doubt that anyone interested in philosophy of art can learn from it.

A couple of small complaints: the original sources of the essays are nowhere identified and occasionally the editing of the book is slipshod (as, for example, when 'adieu' is used where 'ado' is clearly intended [p. 367]).