Art, Mind, and Narrative: Themes from the Work of Peter Goldie

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Julian Dodd (ed.), Art, Mind, and Narrative: Themes from the Work of Peter Goldie, Oxford University Press, 2016, 271pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198769736.

Reviewed by Cain Todd, Lancaster University


It can be a challenge to provide a general sense of the contents of philosophical anthologies -- and hence to avoid a mere summary -- unless they are particularly constrained and unified by their theme. Even then, it is impossible to do anything like equal justice to all of the contributions. In the case of this volume, the collected papers are unified to the extent that they all focus on Peter Goldie's main philosophical concerns. Although these concerns were extremely wide ranging, they were more or less connected by the themes of narrative, art, and emotion, and by Goldie's distinctive recognition of the complexity and relative disorder of our mental lives. Few other philosophers have managed so convincingly, and elegantly, to use a deep appreciation of art works to illuminate our affective sense of self, and to employ an acute insight into the nature of our emotions in order to cast an equally perceptive light on our engagement with, and the value of, art. The way in which the complexity of these apparently disparate, and yet fundamentally connected, themes was both acknowledged and yet also coherently and insightfully explored by Goldie, represents an impressive philosophical achievement, and one deserving of such an excellent volume as this. Indeed, one of the most helpful things that this review can do is simply to point the interested reader to the excellent introduction by Julian Dodd, which provides very useful summaries of all the papers included, and also manages to give a coherent picture of some of the central issues and problems dominating Goldie's work, as well as a good sense of the richness of Goldie's approach to them.

Overall, the volume includes a nice mixture of empirical and conceptual concerns, a mixture that marked Goldie's best work. Amongst the expected disagreements with some of Goldie's central claims, there is much broad agreement, and all the papers form something of a consensus around the idea that art (no less than empirical psychology) -- or at least certain aspects of certain art forms [narrative fiction particularly] -- offers important insights into the affective dimensions of human nature, and that our inner lives are too rich and complex to be neatly shoehorned into simplistic philosophical theories. Inevitably, some of the papers focus more directly on Goldie's work than others, and one virtue of the volume is that the former are of uniformly high enough quality to ensure that the issues they treat are not too narrowly focussed; whilst the latter together offer a rewardingly broad survey of a number of philosophical areas.

This is most strikingly the case in the chapter by Paul Harris, which does not even reference Goldie's work, and which yet offers some really important insights into the nature and intentionality of our emotions, one of Goldie's main themes. Marshalling a range of interesting empirical evidence, Harris argues that most human emotional experiences, and hence the majority of our emotional lives, are directed towards and arise out of what he calls a mental rather than a physical space; in particular, a mental rather than physical proximity to persons, objects, and situations. In other words, Harris places thoughts and imaginings centre stage in explaining the nature of emotions and their content. The claim is utterly plausible and remarkably simple, and yet goes against many of the assumptions, examples, and claims standardly made by philosophers about the emotions, which focus primarily on occurrent states directed at physically proximal stimuli. The so-called paradox of fiction, to take just one example, suddenly seems based on a pretty straightforward, and typically philosophical, misunderstanding of emotions. One can imagine that Goldie, writing with great insight of the complexity of emotional processes over time and in response to sophisticated thoughts, would have wholeheartedly approved.

Goldie was both attracted to, and yet sceptical of, the idea that an appeal to fictional narratives could explain and anchor certain metaphysical and phenomenal-psychological aspects of personal identity. Typically, he tried to steer a middle course between narrativist and sceptical approaches, siding with the former in claiming that narratives played an important role in self-understanding, and with the latter that narratives do not constitute personal identity, and that certain aspects of narratives -- in particular fictional narratives -- can lead to important distortions when used to structure our autobiographies. A similar rejection of competing extremes can be seen in Goldie's work on the emotions, which tries to avoid the over-intellectualising tendency of cognitivst views, whilst simultaneously introducing some intentionality and rationality to non-cognitivist or Jamesian views. And here too we find a similar worry about certain distorting effects, in this case of emotions on what Goldie called 'the epistemic landscape'.

In respect of personal identity, one of the most rewarding papers is by Marya Schechtman, who focuses on specific challenges to her own view offered by Goldie and does a convincing job of responding to them, whilst at the same time tackling some large issues about the nature of personal identity. Schechtman worries that continuity accounts of personal identity fail to adequately explain cases where individuals undergo some kind of radical psychological change, and where we wish to speak of the same person (construed literally) being (in some more figurative sense) different. To address this, she appeals to the notion of 'empathic access' to one's past, which allows her to give an account of the ways in which, and degrees to which, we can be thought to remain both the same (literal) person, and yet also sufficiently different as to be able to claim that we are no longer the person we were. Focussing on Goldie's objection that the 'demand for empathic access does not allow for positive transformations within a single life' (p. 25), Schecthman modifies her original view by making a crucial distinction between phenomenological access to and endorsement of (or sympathy with) one's former 'self'.

Schechtman nonetheless acknowledges, with Goldie, the range and complexity of the various psychological phenomena at issue here, and the intricate ways in which memory, imagination, and emotion combine in overlapping perspectival layers when thinking of past, present, and future selves. Goldie was particularly interested in the gap between our current and past perspectives on ourselves, and adopted the notions of dramatic irony and free indirect speech from fictional narratives to try to understand how we could simultaneously adopt contrasting perspectives from the standpoint of a unified self.

Peter Lamarque argues that Goldie's scepticism about the role of narrative in constructing personal identity does not go far enough because it overestimates the psychological unity of persons, or at least fails to acknowledge its contingency. A fundamental problem for Goldie here, and one that Schechtman also touches upon, is that there is no obvious (or at least no clearly articulated) analogue of the narrator in his account of personal identity, one that can do the work of sustaining the notions of dramatic irony and free indirect speech that he requires. But perhaps another problem is the way in which our multiple, apparently incompatible perspectives on our temporally extended 'selves' led Goldie to use narrative fiction as a model for self-understanding in the first place; one could argue that Goldie was stretching the ideas of dramatic irony and free indirect speech beyond their usefulness. That is, one might suspect that -- unusually for a philosopher so sensitive to the complexity of the phenomena -- Goldie was too carried away here by philosophical theorising.

Kathleen Stock offers a fascinating account of the problem of combining different perspectives from the standpoint of fictional engagement, rather than self-understanding. How can we actively and simultaneously attend to the (incompatible) perspectives of a character in imagination, for which the parallel is our past selves in (recalled) memory, and that of the narrator, for which the parallel is ourselves, now? Stock suggests that the solution, in the fictional case, lies in imagining at different times, rather than simultaneously, the perspectives of character and narrator, which is compatible with maintaining the memory of the former. A bigger problem would be to see how the different perspectives could be integrated into a single, coherent perspective. Stock, following Goldie, argues that this cannot be done, insofar as one cannot imagine from the inside consciously believing something which, as part of the scope of what is imagined, one consciously believes is false. Although such a position depends on the, to my mind, dubious assumption that the imagining at issue involves imagining beliefs, the salient question is whether such an integration is demanded or required, either of the reader of a fiction or of a person trying to make sense of their past selves.

Stock suggests that, notwithstanding certain remarks Goldie makes concerning the structure of autobiographical memory, it would be uncharitable to interpret him as demanding this. Rather, she claims, fictional cases of free indirect speech merely require the reader to imagine first one, then the other perspective. There is a nice analogue issue here, which Stock does not explore, concerning the ability to apparently simultaneously be aware of a fiction as such, and yet also lose oneself sufficiently to experience emotions towards it. Yet, even if she is right to insist on the impossibility of simultaneously imagining incoherent points of view (and that this is what is required in the relevant fictional cases of free indirect speech and dramatic irony), it is less clear that remembering one's past, different perspective centrally involves applying incompatible predicates to a past situation, or cannot in some way be integrated into one's present point of view. It would thus be interesting to explore more thoroughly the similarities and differences between memory and imagination (and their relations to attention) that arise from Stock's interesting discussion.

Abstracting from conceptual issues, David Papineau offers a plausible naturalistic, evolutionary explanation of our tendency to think in narrative terms that does not rely on, but indeed ultimately explains, the function and appreciation of narrative fiction. He argues that it is a consequence of a basic human capacity to construct histories allocentrically; that is to say, as structuring events in relationship to each other in an objective temporal framework. One of the main purposes of this, he surmises, is to help us make long-term plans that serve our interests. In this way, planning in the context of historical constructions -- where memory plays an absolutely essential role -- to accomplish things that we value helps to explain Goldie's conception of the role of narrative in self-understanding, a conception which emphasises the role of memory and narrative in highlighting salient values.

Also approaching Goldie's work from an empirical point of view, this time his work on emotion, Joel Smith argues against the idea, defended by Goldie, that emotions are genuine perceptions of value, primarily because evaluative properties play no explanatory role in determining the evaluative 'look' of things. As for the idea that we can literally see emotions via the facial expression of emotions, Smith explores some interesting empirical evidence appearing to show, against many standard views of emotional expression, that contextual factors play a crucial role in determining the interpretations of facial expressions. This role seems, prima facie, to be at odds with the idea that our experiences of emotional facial expressions are genuine perceptions of emotion. Smith argues that a perceptual account can nonetheless be defended if we build the reference to context into our analysis; roughly, competent observers can recognize contextually situated emotions on the basis of people having expressions of the sort that most things having such expressions 'around here' have only if they are experiencing that emotion. It is difficult to say whether Goldie would have found this, relatively convoluted, kind of competent observer analysis congenial to his own rather more elegant view. Smith gives a good account of why the same kind of scepticism about value perception need not apply to emotion perception, yet one might certainly worry that we have wandered quite some distance from a notion of genuine perceptual recognition.

A similar type of worry, it seems to me, arises from the otherwise highly original and interesting contribution of Dominic Lopes. One of Goldie's passions -- both philosophical and non-philosophical -- was conceptual art, and while Julian Dodd offers a range of interesting arguments against Goldie's thesis that conceptual artworks are ideas, Lopes tries to salvage what he calls the 'experience thesis' in relation to such works. Lopes concentrates on an account of perceptual experience that is much wider than mere sensory experience. All experiences, he argues, are states that encode information in analogue form for delivery to cognition downstream, which is in completely digital form. In this way, Lopes claims, the aesthetic properties of conceptual artworks are represented in a genuinely experiential state. The thesis is difficult to evaluate. It is unclear to me how this account is supposed to explain works where there may be no analogue vehicle, but, more importantly, one might wonder whether the notion of experience is being stretched far too thinly and far too easily to bear the explanatory weight put upon it. Alternatively, would it not be more economical and less convoluted simply to argue that cognitive states also have phenomenology, and thereby count as experiences? It is not entirely clear what work the digital/analogue distinction is actually doing beyond this.

Typically, one of the most enjoyable contributions comes from Ronald de Sousa, who, like Goldie, is keen to stress the complexity of complex phenomena and yet equally adept at tackling the subject with elegance, gusto, and insight. This time, it is 'love.' De Sousa is refreshingly sceptical about the univocity of the concept, the homogeneity of the experience, and even the emotionality of the phenomenon (or phenomena). He approaches the difficult subject of whether love is responsive to reasons very much in the spirit of Goldie, arguing that thinking of (an individual's) love in terms of its particular narrative or historical development might -- he claims with some justified hesitancy -- provide an answer. In doing so, he discusses, with evident approval, Goldie's suggestion that we view love in the light of Aristophanes' wonderful myth: two halves fusing together to make a whole.