Art of Philosophy: A Selection of Jerzy Perzanowski's Work

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Jerzy Perzanowski, Art of Philosophy: A Selection of Jerzy Perzanowski's Work, Janusz Sytnik-Czetwertyński (ed.), Ontos, 2012, 255pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381306.

Reviewed by Jan Woleński, Jagiellonian University


I cannot abstain from personal recollections about the author of this book. I met Jerzy as a student of philosophy at Jagiellonian University in Kraków. Although he was younger, we attended the same classes, particularly seminars of Izydora Dąmbska, Roman Ingarden and Kazimierz Pasenkiewicz. Jerzy's attitude to philosophy was extremely serious. He always considered philosophy as a genuine science (in the sense of German Wissenschaft). Perzanowski became interested in logic, an important part of the Polish philosophical curriculum. He decided to study mathematics as his second subject and specialized in topology. After graduating in philosophy, Jerzy was appointed in the Department of Logic. He considered logic as the foundation of philosophy and believed that logical methods can actually convert philosophical speculation into legitimate scientific theories. However, his work was not limited to applications of logic to philosophy. He was a creative logician and achieved important results in modal logic (the deduction theorem for some modal systems). Jerzy became a very popular logician in Poland just after graduation, due to his course on modal logic in one of the Polish Schools of Logic at the end of the 1960s. It was quite impressive to see professors of logic listening to lectures on Kripke's semantics delivered by a very young magister (magister is the academic title obtained by a graduate at Polish universities).

This collection is published posthumously (Perzanowski died in 2009; he was 66 years old). The title is fitting given Perzanowski's metaphilosophical views. The book contains two introductory essays by the editor. The first one ("Jerzy Perzanowski -- real man and real philosopher") outlines Perzanowski's curriculum vitae and briefly mentions his views. The second essay ("Introduction to Jerzy Perzanowski's Way to Monadology") tries to give an account of Perzanowski's idea of monadology. The main body of the book collects the following essays by Perzanowski : 1. "In Praise of Philosophy"; 2. "Reasons of Monodeism"; 3. "Towards Combination Metaphysics"; 4. "Onto\logical Melioration"; 5. "Locative Ontology"; 6. "In Search of Onto\logical Conditions of Emergence"; 7. "Towards Psycho-ontology"; 8. "Modal Logics of Truth and Falsity"; 9. "Classical (Modal) Logic of the Square of Opposition"; 10. "Combination Semantics for Intensional Logics, Makings and Their Use in Combination Semantics"; 11. "A profile of Masonic Synthesis". There is a short bibliography. Essays 1, 3, 4 and 5 are published for the first time, the rest were previously published in various journals and collections.

The book displays Perzanowski's interests and his way of doing philosophy. Essay 1 is purely metaphilosophical and presents his understanding of the art of philosophy. On his view, philosophy is a collection of disciplines, and not only theory. Logic and ontology (in its classical sense, that is, as the theory of being plus the theory of ontological possibilities constituting the ontological space) are perhaps the most important fields of philosophy. Logic provides the most efficient and universal philosophical method (Perzanowski followed Jan Łukasiewicz's view that logic is the ethics of language and thought--although Łukasiewicz spoke about morality not ethics). Ontology, however, displays the basic structures of thought and reality. Philosophical problems are real (not pseudo-problems) and can be scientifically framed, analyzed and, finally, solved. Perzanowski recommended formalization and axiomatization of philosophical theories. He applied various logical tools and warned against restricting them to one selected system, for instance, classical logic. As a practitioner of modal logic, Perzanowski not only made extensive use of modal systems, but also employed mereology combined with other formal structures. He invented the label 'logical philosophy' in order to have a convenient name for the philosophical enterprise he favored.

With regard to historical influences, Leibniz was his main philosophical hero. In general, Perzanowski had a considerable sympathy for the great rationalists, like Parmenides, Plato, Anselm of Canterbury, Descartes, Leibniz, Husserl (Perzanowski's ontology as the theory of ontological possibilities is patterned on ideas of Husserl's student, Roman Ingarden) and Wittgenstein (interpreted as a rationalist and not as a predecessor of logical empiricism). He even looked toward a logic of strict or radical rationalism. According to him, this logic should adopt the principle that every truth is necessary. It is interesting that Perzanowski's studies on modal logic suggested to him the rule that (i) 'necessarily A' can be inferred from A. However, this rule does not imply that A and 'necessarily A' are logically equivalent. Due to the fact that the deduction theorem does not hold for modal logic (I skip details), (i) does not necessarily lead to (ii) 'if A, then necessarily A' as a theorem, although the reverse theorem (if necessarily A, then A) is valid.

The rest of the essays develop logical philosophy in various directions. Essays 2, 3, 4, 5, 6 and 10 concern ontology and its various formal bases. Perzanowski understands "monodeism" (essay 1) as monotheism. However, he does not defend a particular religious confession, for instance, Christianity, but outlines a kind of onto-theology or theo-logic, that is, an ontological theory of God as the Most Perfect Being. "Towards Combination Metaphysics" (essay 3) discusses various ontological connections, in particular, the modal ones. To develop a suitable formal machinery, Perzanowski generalizes the idea of truth-making to making possible, real, actual, factual etc. and gives a sketch of the ontologic of making. For instance, x makes y a fact if it makes y possible (or real) and y is a fact. Further topics in this essay are (inter alia) propositions, processes and events. Essay 4 returns to theo-logic. Ontological melioration is related to a binary relation (defined over the universe of all objects) 'x is better (greater) than y'. Since this phrase can be also read 'x melior y', we have the term 'ontological melioration'. Perzanowski presents historical meliorative arguments given by Anselm and Augustine. In a systematic way, meliorations are compared with such formal constructions as filtrations and diagonalizations. "Locative ontology" (essay 5) concerns some formal aspects of ontological spaces, for instance, their type of ordering. We find here a very interesting attempt to combine set-theoretical ontology with mereology. As is very well-known to all practitioners of logical analysis, such a combination is perhaps the most critical point in employing formal methods in philosophy.

Essay 6 sketches ontological properties of emergence. Contrary to typical approaches to this difficult concept, Perzanowski constructs a formal theory of emergence without taking the concept of function (in the biological sense) as basic. He also compares emergence with ontological melioration. Psycho-ontology is the topic of essay 7. Perzanowski considers psycho-ontology the key to the philosophy of mind and attributes this approach to Leibniz. Psycho-ontology is preceded by combination ontology and location ontology as they are described in essays 3 and 5. The main aim of the construction in this essay is to show how thoughts are located and allocated. The next three essays (8-10) are more logical than ontological. The titles of essays 8 and 9 are fairly transparent and sufficiently summarize their topics. Essay 10 is based on the principle that all proper semantics must be based on ontology. Thematically, this essay returns to essay 3 and joins combination semantics with combination metaphysics. According to Perzanowski, this approach allows us to explain some peculiarities of modal logics, for instance, correspondences between various modal axioms. The last essay offers a logical treatment of analysis and synthesis, two methods considered as pillars of the Western philosophical tradition. The adjective 'masonic' (or 'mosaical') is explained by the phrase 'the more bricks you use, the more you can build'. Put another way, the richness of elements determines the shape of products composed from them. Analysis proceeds from composites to their elements; synthesis 'moves' in the reverse direction. The proper ontological theory must take into account both processes, that is, it must be the theory of analysis and synthesis. Perzanowski does not stop with such general observations. He gives examples of how to build modal and Boolean theories of analysis and synthesis.

Doubtless, The Art of Philosophy contains essays that well represent Perzanowski's general approach to philosophy as well as his analysis of many particular philosophical problems. In particular, this book contains ingenious logical tools and their analytic applications. Yet I am uneasy with some features of the volume. Spelling is not uniform; sometimes, for example, '\' will be inserted into ontology ('onto\logical') although there is no justification for deviating from the word's ordinary spelling. The structure of the logical square in essay 9 is not uniform, that is, the particular points refer to various rules. For instance, the upper segment connects items that are paired by diagonals in typical versions of the square. The bibliography is very poor and omits some works to which Perzanowski refers. There is no index and no bibliography of Perzanowski's writings. It appears that the editor did not try to give a coherent shape to already published papers and unpublished items are presented  as they appeared in manuscript. The second introductory essay is not very helpful as a guide to Perzanowski's ideas, because it is written as pars pro toto: monadology forms only one of Perzanowski's interests. The above reservations are mostly technical. but they document that the editor did not perform a good job in his work on the collection.

However, there are many substantial objections. In particular, Perzanowski published more important papers than those included in The Art of Philosophy. In particular, his masterpiece Modal Logic and Philosophy (the habilitation thesis, published in 1989) is omitted. This small book offers the most extensive analysis of applications of modal logic to philosophy. This would have required translating it from Polish, but the work deserves it. Other omissions concern papers offering Perzanowski's original interpretation of Wittgenstein and a very valuable paper 'The Way of Truth' (1993) devoted to Parmenides and his famous poem. Even if the publisher restricted the space available (as an editor of a volume for Ontos, I do not believe that this was the case), the editor could have done a better job of managing the space. Essay 9 (on classical modal square of oppositions) contains well-known material and could be omitted without much loss. Moreover, Perzanowski had not published it, and it is uncertain whether he would have wanted it to appear in the present version. Other unpublished essays (1, 3 and 5) also deserved more elaboration from the editorial point of view. Also, there are no cross-references between papers in the collection or references to Perzanowski's other published works. A bit more work on the part of the editor would have easily avoided these weaknesses.

Although the collection The Art of Philosophy could be better, it still remains a very valuable philosophical document. In particular, it successfully demonstrates the potential of logical philosophy. Although I am much more skeptical than Jerzy Perzanowski regarding the scientific status of philosophy and the prospects of converting it into a genuine science, I can recommend this book to everyone interested in the relationship between logic and philosophy as well as in the specific problems Perzanowski discusses.