Art, Politics and Rancière: Broken Perceptions

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Tina Chanter, Art, Politics and Rancière: Broken Perceptions, Bloomsbury, 2018, 180pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 97810472510563.

Reviewed by Joseph Tanke, University of Hawaii, Mānoa


Tina Chanter attempts to open an important and much-needed dialogue between Jacques Rancière and theorists of race and gender. Chanter suggests that not only are race and gender largely absent from Rancière's writings, but that his various analyses of politics, art, and the intersections between aesthetics and politics more generally are hampered by this blindspot. However, far from disqualifying Rancière's conception of politics, Chanter's investigations seem to confirm the viability of Rancière's framework, not only for its ability to accommodate struggles against racial and gender-based discrimination but indeed to actively facilitate these movements.

Chanter's major claim is that Rancière's account of politics (i.e., democracy) as the polemical assertion, staging, and confirmation of equality is overdetermined by the fact that some of its central notions are derived from readings of Plato and Aristotle. The substance of Chanter's criticism pertains to how we should understand Rancière's concept of the "part of those without part." For Rancière, the part of those without part is both the subject and object of politics. It designates those who, upon finding themselves excluded from a community's initial accounting of itself, constitute themselves into a subject in order to address the initial wrong of their exclusion. The part of those without part is also the object of politics since its very existence is at issue in political contestation.

Across seven loosely related chapters dealing with various aspects of Rancière's corpus and his relationships with major figures in the Continental tradition, Chanter raises a series of questions, many of them unanswered, as to whether or not the part of those without part has been sufficiently reworked so as to facilitate the work of those who are prevented from taking part in a community on the basis of identity-based forms of exclusion. Even though Chanter herself points out that a number of Rancière's examples of politics draw upon the attempts that were made by women and people of color to demonstrate their equality, and thus their legitimate right to take part in the life of a community, she nevertheless suggests that Rancière's conception of politics partakes of a "white, masculinist logic" that makes the concept of the part of those without part, and thus Rancière's conception of democracy, unfriendly, if not hostile to, these concerns (20-21).

Unfortunately, however, Chanter fails to provide readers -- all of whom should be concerned with questions about the complex relationships between class, race, gender, and sexual orientation -- with a compelling philosophical argument as to why they, like Chanter, would necessarily find their "concerns dismissed, elided or rendered equivalent to a part that has no part, a part that does not see, must not see, race and gender" (15). Like many Anglophone readers, Chanter fails to properly contextualize Rancière's writings on politics, and thus fails to understand their real significance for these questions. For example, it is important to remind ourselves that a large part of Rancière's thinking in Disagreement: Politics and Philosophy (1999) was carried out with the purpose of resisting those who in the 1990s were proclaiming the end of history. By re-conceiving of democracy as dissensus, Rancière sought not just to undermine these triumphalist discourses of consensus, but to create a framework for taking account of the oppressed and marginalized peoples still fighting for justice throughout Latin America, Africa, Eastern Europe, and especially les sans-papiers in France.[1]

Rancière's writings have recently attracted considerable attention within many art circles, where he is largely known for his ideas regarding the "politics of aesthetics." It is important to understand that when discussing the politics of art and aesthetics, Rancière is not interested in whatever political views may happen to be expressed by artists or encapsulated in individual artworks themselves. More generally, he is interested in how art -- understood as a series of historically conditioned practices, capable of altering what can be seen, heard, and understood within a given society -- touches upon the aesthetic dimension of politics or what he has called the "distribution of the sensible" [le partage du sensible].[2]In the central chapters Chanter presents readers with some of the relevant background in Continental thought that will enable them to appreciate Rancière's core concerns. For example, in an important chapter dedicated to elaborating Rancière's views on art, Chanter shows how Kantian and Hegelian notions contributed to his politicized vision of aesthetics. Likewise, Chanter dedicates a chapter to explaining how, in elaborating his different regimes of art, Rancière draws upon but ultimately transforms Foucault's archaeological approach to the history of ideas.[3] In this respect, I agree with Chanter when she praises Rancière for his ability to reshape our relationship with canonical thinkers. Chanter explains that Rancière "makes it easier to dip into the history of philosophy, as if you were licking an ice cream, easier to find something that is very much more to your taste than you might have found before" (164). Unfortunately, however, Chanter does not dip into the history of philosophy nearly enough, for the importance of Kant, Hegel, and Foucault for Rancière has already been well established. And so, for longtime and new readers alike, it would be more useful to see a discussion of his work carried out in terms of figures such as Vico, Winckelmann, Schelling, and the early Romantics -- all of whom Rancière credits with contributing to the formation of the "aesthetic regime of art." It is likewise surprising that Chanter does not deal with a number of Rancière's major publications, most significantly, The Ignorant Schoolmaster (1991) and Aisthesis (2013). The latter is Rancière's most important contribution on aesthetics to date, and an obvious starting point for considering his views on art.

In The Ignorant Schoolmaster, Rancière introduces readers to the life and work of Joseph Jacotot, an obscure pedagogical reformer from the nineteenth century, whose principle of intellectual emancipation is essential to understanding Rancière's own thinking regarding education, politics, and art. From Jacotot, Rancière learned to distinguish intelligence, which is immaterial and thought to be equal, from its manifestations, which are material and thus inevitably unequal. Rancière, following Jacotot, holds that emancipation begins with the supposition that all intelligences are equal, and it continues as long as this assumption can be maintained against its inevitable chorus of detractors. Rancière's intention is not to try to prove that all intelligences are equal, but to see what becomes possible under this assumption. And, as he explains, one may persist in regarding all intelligences as equal, as long as the opposite hypothesis isn't proven true. In this way, the equality of intelligences is intended to create a new starting point for politics, one that is at odds with the world of hierarchy. The equality of intelligences is a thought that sustains a fundamentally different logic of communicative exchange, one which Rancière describes in terms of the difference between stultification and emancipation, and which he envisions as common to both democratic politics and aesthetic art. Inasmuch as Chanter professes to question the logic informing Rancière's project, one would expect her to deal with these ideas in some detail. Jacotot is demonstrably more important for Rancière's conception of politics than Aristotle, and many readers will thus expect an argument from Chanter regarding how it is that the postulate that all intelligences are equal proves detrimental to marginalized peoples.

It is true, as Chanter states, that Rancière's core concepts were developed in an effort to reconcile a rehabilitated idea of democracy with a more classically Marxist notion of class struggle. However, after reading Chanter, I see no compelling reason why this structure cannot be used to facilitate struggles against racist oppression or gender-based discrimination, and on behalf of the rights of the LGBQT community. Politics, for Rancière, is about creating the stage on which those who have been excluded from the community appear as the equals of those who deny their admittance. And, as many have already suggested, this analysis proves useful for understanding the processes by which those who have been excluded from a community, for whatever reason, begin to take part in it through the assertion and defense of their equality. In fact, the empty universality at work in Rancière's conception of equality, when coupled with his idea that politics is performative, suggests that it is possible, if nevertheless difficult, to reconcile the often-opposed claims of class, race, and gender.

In other chapters, Chanter addresses what she perceives to be a lacuna within Rancière's thinking regarding art by countering some of his celebrated analyses of individual works of art and literature with the concerns of feminist art historians and literary theorists. For example, Chanter offers a counter-reading of Flaubert's Madame Bovary intended to point towards the limits of Rancière's own approach when he reads that novel as expressing Flaubert's conflicting allegiances to romanticism and realism. Chanter finds that Rancière "downplays the gendered dynamic that Flaubert is exploiting" when he ultimately punishes Emma for the romantic dream of wanting to blur the boundary between art and life (8). In other places, Chanter attempts to develop a "counternarrative to the story . . . that Rancière tells" about the intersections between art and politics by discussing the works of the Guerrilla Girls, Gillian Wearing, and Claudia Rankine (16). Chanter uses the work of the Guerrilla Girls to question Rancière's critique of didactic art -- an issue that both the Ignorant Schoolmaster and Aisthesis shed light upon -- before rehearsing a well-worn series of questions about how the art world disproportionally represents women and artists of color. To be clear, these are important questions that we should never tire of raising; unfortunately, Chanter does not offer any new empirical findings or propose any theoretical advances.

Chanter's discussions of fine art would be more compelling if they were not at points undermined by historical inaccuracies and unwarranted simplifications. At one point, for example, Chanter writes that Marcel Duchamp "shocks the world by placing a urinal in a museum and calling it art" (89). In fact, Duchamp submitted the work Fountain (1917) under the name of R. Mutt to the Society of Independent Artists in order to have it considered for its first annual exhibition at the Grand Central Palace -- a temporary exhibition hall, not a museum. The work did not shock the world as much as it did the Society, whose principles of open access Duchamp sought to challenge.[4] The larger art world learned of the kerfuffle that ensued when Fountain was rejected only because Duchamp himself carried out a vigorous and public defense of "R. Mutt." The urinals found in museums throughout the world today are replicas that Duchamp commissioned in the 1960s, and they could be used to raise a series of interesting question à la Rancière about how certain objects come to take part in the concept of art while others do not.

It might seem trivial to some to raise these points regarding Duchamp when considering Chanter's efforts to introduce more female artists into the framework developed by Rancière. However, to my mind, it is symptomatic of her tendency to reify the art world and its mechanisms of inclusion and exclusion. For some, the art world still centers upon the Met and the Guggenheim. But for others, there are worlds of art that are infinitely more nuanced, diverse, and interesting. These worlds are born whenever the human mind marks out a difference with the tedium of everyday life -- in places as varied as Berlin, Beijing, and Buffalo. These are the worlds that Rancière's writings have helped to render intelligible, and to which his thought invites us to take part.


Rancière, Jacques (1991), The Ignorant Schoolmaster: Five Lessons in Intellectual Emancipation, trans. Kristin Ross (Stanford University Press).

Rancière, Jacques (1999), Disagreement: Politics and Philosophy, trans. Julie Rose (University of Minnesota Press).

Rancière, Jacques (2013), Aisthesis: Scenes From the Aesthetic Regime of Art, trans. Zakir Paul (Verso Press).

[1] The movement of the sans papiers, or those without papers, began in the 1990s and continues to this day. It formed in order to defend and support the approximately 400,000 people of African descent living in France as immigrants and refugees. It is one of the most active and visible political movements in France.

[2] The "distribution of the sensible" is the key concept that unites Rancière's disparate writings on the history of the workers' movement, the notion of democracy, as well as the practices of literature, art, and cinema. With this notion, Rancière analyzes how the partitioning of space and time, together with the distribution of bodies and voices, determines what is sensible, intelligible, and thus possible at any given moment. It is important to underscore that Rancière's original French formulation, "partage du sensible," is intended to emphasize that these distributions are shared. The distribution of the sensible/sharing of the sensible thus names the series of divisions, distributions, and hierarchies by which a common world is constituted.

[3] Rancière distinguishes between three different ways of relating art to politics. The "ethical regime of images" designates the attempt to subordinate images, whether plastic, literary, or auditory to the ethos of a given community. For Plato, whose warnings against poetry are paradigmatic in this regard, images are to be judged in terms of their effects upon the community. Within this regime, "art" as such does not exist. "The representative regime of art" refers to the artistic canons known today as the belles-lettres and the beaux-arts. The axioms of this regime defined a strict separation between art and life, and gave rise to a series of hierarchies that were based upon an evaluation of the subjects represented therein. If the ethical regime of images found inspiration in the writings of Plato, the representative regime is derived from Aristotle's Poetics. It granted art some autonomy, while nevertheless restricting its effects to those of a healing catharsis. The "aesthetic regime of art" is the most complex of all the regimes that Rancière describes. It refers to the movement by which artists, critics, and thinkers, at the close of the eighteenth century, began to re-think what makes art, art. According to Rancière, the aesthetic regime abolishes the hierarchies and forms of subordination to which the other two regimes give rise. The aesthetic regime thus created an ambiguous sensorium in which art and life enter into contact with each other without thereby surrendering their differences. In works like Aisthesis, Rancière has used the notion of the aesthetic regime to re-narrate the history of nineteenth- and twentieth-century art.

[4] As is well known, the founding charter of the Society of Independent Artists explained that any artist who paid the requisite fee would have his or her works included in the exhibition. Duchamp himself was a member of the Society's board, and he resigned his position after the work of "R. Mutt" was rejected.