Art's Emotions: Ethics, Expression and Aesthetic Experience

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Damien Freeman, Art's Emotions: Ethics, Expression and Aesthetic Experience, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2012, 210pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN: 9780773540064.

Reviewed by Sarah Worth, Furman University


Damien Freeman takes on the monumental task of developing a theory of aesthetic experience that accounts for its emotional aspects, its ethical aspects, and the role certain kinds of aesthetic experience can play in a fulfilling life. Despite the enormity of the task, he does an excellent job in so few pages. There are, of course, problems, but the issues that I take with the argument are largely in the details and not in the big picture. Freeman's main argument is that aesthetic experience can uniquely offer a form of what he calls a plenary experience of emotion. This particular kind of experience is significant to the aesthetic experience because it deals with our emotions as a whole (what he calls the whole emotional economy rather than just parts of the emotions) and thereby offers a unique kind of experience that plays a significant role in our overall thriving emotional life. Freeman's argument takes as its context the expressivist theories of Tolstoy, Collingwood, and Wollheim; but I believe that he advances his argument to a more comprehensive account of the ways in which we engage with art emotionally and why it is good for us to do so.

Freeman begins his argument with what I took to be a rather odd example; that of a particular kind of Chinese art that combines poetry, calligraphy, and painting. (I took it as odd since this is not a characteristically Western ideal of art practice.  In a Western argument about aesthetic expressiveness, opera might have been a more fitting example to begin with). A single artwork that combines all three is known as a work of the "three perfections" (1). Freeman uses this example in order to talk about the higher level of expressivity that can result from the interactions of the aspects if all three are executed exceedingly well individually. The artwork that can express all three will presumably be judged not just for the individual parts, but for the combination of the three perfections. Freeman uses this in order to introduce the main question with which he begins the book: "what is this special emotional experience that we have when we engage with each of the three perfections?" (2). He follows by saying that "what is fundamental to understanding their expressiveness is the emotional experience that each offers. The philosophical problem presented by the expressiveness of art is fundamentally a question about the nature and significance of our emotional experience of art" (3). He also questions from the beginning "what is distinctive about the emotional experience of art and what is valuable about this distinctive experience?" (3).

Although these are significant questions, Freeman tackles them in a characteristically philosophical way, addressing emotion on its own first, in what he calls the emotional economy, how we perceive emotion in the world, the kinds of emotional experiences we have, and only then does he introduce the key notion of what he calls the plenary experience of emotion and then explains how this characteristically plenary experience can add to the quality of a life. Another author might have been distracted by the immense amount of research in other fields having to do with the psychology of emotion and possibly the neuroscience as well of both emotion and perception. Freeman, however, sticks to the philosophical arguments as well as the historical context of his topic, citing mainly historical figures (Kant, James, Dewey) rather than any of the current literature on the topic (Ronald de Sousa, Patricia Greenspan, Martha Nussbaum and even Susan Feagin are conspicuously left out of all his discussions of emotion). Jenefer Robinson is the only contemporary figure who Freeman contrasts himself with at all. Freeman readily admits, however, that the kind of theory of mind and emotions that he needs is one that is "expansive rather than restricted" and that "the thriving contemporary literature on the definition of emotion has not featured in this account" (36). I think he would have been better served to argue for the need for the historical context (particularly Wollheim's work) rather than ignore the contemporary context all together.

Very simply, Freeman develops an account of emotion in terms of what he calls externalized and projective properties. Externalized properties are those we perceive external to us, like a smile. We may, he says, interpret the smile as just a mere curling of the lips or as an indication of pleasure on the part of the person smiling. He uses Wollheim heavily here to describe how the externalized properties work. Projective properties, on the other hand, Freeman says, develop from the cultivation of three capacities. First, "the agent must be capable of projection. Second, the agent must become aware that some acts of projection endure . . . and third, the agent must be able to perceive a projective property when he appreciates that a certain object has the potential to sustain the projection of a particular emotion if it were projected" (57). Projection, as Freeman describes it, is the ability to transfer the feeling one has about one part of the world onto another part or object. Freeman says that we do this "as if by excreting and smearing it onto that external object, thereby allowing the archaic mind to imagine that the feeling is no longer part of its own psychology" (57). I am skeptical of the excreting and smearing part of this projection, but I don't take issue with the basic act of projection. He explains that we project colors (red with terror, for instance (65)), shapes, and sounds. He says that we are able to perceive projective properties in paintings as well as in music, and presumably many other arts. Freeman also limits his discussion of (aesthetic) emotions almost exclusively to fear and pleasure. I think more varied options would have provided a more realistic background for what he intended to do.

His development of our capacity to experience externalized and projective properties leads him to the culmination of his real work, which is to describe the "plenary experience" that we have with art. Freeman explains through chapters two and three the varieties of emotional experiences that we have generally, and then specifically with art. In chapter four he contends that the kind of emotional engagement that we have with art is one in which we engage with the whole emotional economy of feeling. He says that this particular kind of engagement is the thing that makes art distinctive and "which justifies regarding the experience as involving a distinctive variety of expressive perception" (116). He does not say all art necessarily does this, nor that all observers of art objects will have the same emotional response. Rather, he argues that the particular kind of emotional experience art gives rise to makes it distinctive among other kinds of emotional experiences.

I presume that the threefold kind of "emotional economy" that art engages with is a reference to the threefold skill referenced in the beginning of the book with the "three perfections" of the Chinese art. So the plenary experience is a unique experience that culminates from an experience of the whole emotional economy as opposed to only one part. Freeman argues that it "constitutes a distinctive way of engaging with emotion . . . when we have a plenary experience of emotion, the world engages with us as the kind of emotional creatures that we really are: it is an engagement with our emotion as in one sense something that happens to us, and in another sense something that we do. This distinguishes it from other ways of engaging with emotion" (119). So engaging with art can produce a unique kind of emotional experience. It is not prompted by "significant form" or other means of expressivist philosophies, but it is a special kind of prompt that allows us this plenary experience of (aesthetic) emotion. This explanation of the plenary experience of emotion is the real achievement of this book. The first three chapters are preparatory work for this explanation of this special experience that art offers, and the last chapter just explores implications of the plenary experience for a more fulfilling life. I think that the argument for the plenary experience is one that should make its way into the canon of expressivist theories alongside Collingwood and Bell.

The last part of the book takes the plenary experience of emotion one step further to connect the experience itself with the benefits that it might give us as humans. The benefits Freeman chooses are ultimately tied to moral experiences. He does this carefully, giving excellent context (the work of Berys Gaut, in particular), but I am not sure that one needs to connect the aesthetic to the ethical in order to really show benefit. Historically, philosophers have wanted to say that to show the real benefit of aesthetic experience one needs either moral or cognitive benefit. Freeman deals with both. He claims that the plenary experience makes a unique contribution to the "good life" (133). He explains this unique contribution as follows:

this approach requires us to identify the particular need that the plenary experience meets. We shall see that when a creature possesses both its own emotional condition and the ability to perceive emotion in the world around it, the need for an engagement between the perception of emotion and the perceiver's own emotional condition arises. Without emotional engagement, how we feel about the world cannot take account of the emotion that we perceive in the world, leaving us in an intolerable state in which we are not at home in the world. One value of plenary experience of emotion, I shall suggest, lies in its ability to meet the need for engagement between the perception of emotion and the perceiver's emotional condition (134).

So the plenary experience is one that connects one's own feeling of emotion to the perceived emotions going on around one. It is the fact that the plenary experience is one that encompasses the whole emotional economy (rather than just individual aspects of it) that allows this experience to be unique. It contributes to the "good life" because it can be fulfilling in a way that no other emotional experience can be. Plenary experiences help us to avoid the feeling of emotional isolation in a unique way.

By the end, Freeman articulates three kinds of evaluations that he feels his analysis can make:

We have reason for valuing art over non-art.

We have a reason for preferring expressive works of art to non-expressive works of art: expressive art realizes the valuable possibility of being at home in the world, a possibility that is unique to art, whereas non-expressive works of art do not.

We have a reason for regarding some expressive works of art as finer works of art than other expressive works of art: some works are arbitrary whereas others have a creative focus or creative tension. (156)

Freeman gives good arguments, I think, for all of these claims. The work is well thought out and well reasoned, despite what I found to be a number of uncharacteristic examples that did not generalize well. This is not a book I would teach to undergraduates, but it would possibly work in a graduate level seminar, especially one which focused on the interaction between aesthetics and ethics.