Art, Self and Knowledge

Placeholder book cover

Keith Lehrer, Art, Self and Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2012, 212pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195304992.

Reviewed by James O. Young, University of Victoria


Keith Lehrer is a philosopher of very considerable distinction but this book will not enhance his reputation. By Lehrer's account, Art, Self and Knowledge began as a book on aesthetics. From there it morphed into a rambling, repetitive exploration of epistemology, the possibility of zombies, human mortality, feminism, the mind-body problem, personal identity, human freedom and a range of other matters. Long stretches are written in an almost impenetrable style. Passages of arcane prolixity are relieved by occasional gnomic aphorisms. ("There is a content of contentlessness marked in experience," (p. 13) and "Negation is coiled in the spring of distinction," (p. 85) are good examples of these enigmatic statements.) Frequently the meaning is buried so deeply that readers need a heidegger to get it out, which is not surprising since Heidegger is one of the acknowledged sources of the book's ideas. When the meaning has been successfully extracted, the claims of the book often turn out to be disappointingly commonplace or profoundly implausible. Judged purely as a book on philosophy of art, Art, Self and Knowledge contributes very little, in part because (judging by the bibliography) Lehrer has read virtually none of the recent literature on the subject. His primary qualification as an aesthetician seems to be that he has taken up painting.

The key to the book is Lehrer's concept of "exemplarization." This concept owes something to Nelson Goodman's discussion of exemplars. (I will avoid Goodman's awkwardly nominalistic way of stating his position and speak freely of properties.) A swatch of fabric, for example, is an exemplar. It is so because some of the properties that it possesses, in particular, its colour and pattern, refer to those properties and to other pieces of fabric that also possess them. Goodman held that works of art also exemplify and denote certain properties. By exemplifying properties, he believed, art is able to provide knowledge of objects in the world that possess these properties. Lehrer has a contrasting account of exemplars. They are not items such as swatches of fabric or works of art. Rather, our experiences of works of art become "exemplarized." An experience of artworks then comes to stand for other experiences: "the exemplar on the theory I am proposing is not some separate eternal and immutable form. It is the experience itself used as an exemplar or standard to stand for experiences." (p. 10) Exemplarization is the process of turning an experience of an artwork into an exemplar that stands for other experiences.

Once experiences have been exemplarized, these experiences change how people think about the world. According to Lehrer, "The mind is provoked to reconstruct the content of the world of art and the world beyond art in a way that keeps it tied in a referential loop to the exemplarized experience." (p. 45) Sometimes Lehrer indulges in a more radical way of speaking by adopting Goodman's talk about "world making." For example Lehrer writes, "I make my world." (p. 88) Most of the time, however, he speaks about exemplarized experiences changing our experience or changing the "content of the world." That is the central claim of the book. The claim that art leads us to conceive of (or see) the world in new ways is not novel. The value of a book making such a claim will depend on its success in revealing how art shapes our experience of the world or its success in giving examples of experience reshaped by art. Lehrer's book is not successful in either way.

Lehrer's first two examples of how art reshapes experience of the world are particularly unhelpful. He writes that, "If Malevich is right, the sensory exemplar of Black Square can show us what something beyond ordinary experience, the supreme, is like. Rothko paintings can show us what experience is like when emptied of the perceptual objects of quotidian experience." (p. 45) Both of these examples have problems. I don't need to channel my inner logical empiricist to wonder what it means to say that a painting can show us what the supreme is like. The claim about the Rothko painting, on the other hand, is trivial. It simply says that an experience of an abstract painting shows viewers what it is like to have an experience that is not an experience of some particular object. In Chapter 3, Lehrer gives some more persuasive examples when he holds that certain feminist artworks (such as Judy Chicago's Dinner Party) are intended "to change experience, to reconfigure with conscious experience how we think and feel about ourselves, our world, and our relation to each other." (p. 52) The trouble is that it is far from obvious that the feminist works in question function by exemplarizing experience.

In general, I am not convinced that talk of the exemplarization of experience of artworks is all that helpful. I agree with Lehrer that we can experience works of art and come to have insight into objects represented in the works. I am simply sceptical about the suggestion that we better understand how works of art convey insight when we are told that we exemplarize experience of artworks. In one of his clearer statements about how exemplars function, Lehrer states that they have "the function of representing objects by showing us what they are like by exhibiting what it itself is like." (pp. 16-17) I do not think that this can be the whole story. Consider this example. A work of art, perhaps a feminist work, may provide the insight that some social institution is unjust. (Lehrer acknowledges works of art can have a moral dimension.) But a work of art cannot be unjust. (It can represent injustice, but that is different from being itself unjust.) So a work of art cannot show us that an institution is unjust by exhibiting one of its own characteristics, namely injustice. This suggests that an account of the exemplarization of the experience of artworks cannot provide a full account of how artworks provide insight.

There are problems with how Lehrer conceives of exemplarized experiences. He believes that "Knowledge requires truth." (p. 5) (Obviously this is a controversial claim. It seems that I can know what it is like to see red without knowing something true.) Lehrer sometimes states that exemplarized experiences (or exemplar representations, as he sometimes calls them) are true. The trouble is that experiences, exemplarized or not, cannot be true or false. They are not propositional and cannot enter into an "inferential network." (p. 4) We see the confusion in this passage:

Exemplarization marks a distinction defining content in such a way that the exemplar representation is true of itself, that is, it is true that the exemplar applies to itself as it applies to other objects it represents. (p. 5)

Lehrer takes the second part of this sentence (after 'that is') to be a paraphrase of the first part. It is not. The statement that the exemplar applies to itself could be true: this is a statement about exemplar representations. The first part of the sentence claims that exemplar representations (that is, exemplarized experiences) can be true and, in particular, true of themselves but, as I say, experiences cannot be true. On other occasions Lehrer suggests that exemplars are not propositional (and so not truth apt). For example, he writes that exemplarized content "shows what cannot be said." (p. 29)

Lehrer uses his reflection on exemplars to provide a definition of art in these terms:

Something is an artwork when it is created or chosen to elicit exemplar representation from aesthetic attention of the receiver responding to what the features of the work are like as new form and content reconfiguring experience in a way that has intrinsic value. (p. 129)

I am not quite sure that I understand this definition, but (using terminology developed by Stephen Davies) Lehrer's definition can be described as functionalist rather than proceduralist. That is, artworks are defined in terms of a common function. Proceduralist definitions define art in terms of the procedure by which they are produced. My reading of the contemporary literature is that the arguments for proceduralism are winning the day, but Lehrer discusses none of this large and sophisticated literature. (He cites nothing more recent than Morris Weitz's classic 1956 article.) Lehrer's definition also appears to commit one of the cardinal sins of any definition of art: it conflates the definition of art with the definition of good art. (p. 62)

Having discussed some questions in aesthetics, Lehrer considers how his remarks on philosophy of art lead to the solution of problems in other areas of philosophy. One of the problems he addresses is the mind-body problem. He writes that

When the content of the artwork, a painting, for example, is incorporated into our exemplar representation of the physical object, it is represented and experienced as having intentionality and phenomenology, the two features of mentality. The artwork becomes, in this way, a mentalized physical object. This dissolves the mind-body problem. (p. 189)

This passage is a little difficult to interpret. On one interpretation it says that if an artwork is represented as having intentionality and phenomenal states, then it has such states. So an artwork is both mental and physical. (Of course, the argument is dubious. From the fact that S is represented as p it does not follow that S is p. From the fact that something is represented as having intentionality one cannot validly infer than it has intentionality.) On the next page, however, Lehrer makes a much more sensible claim in what seems intended as an explication of the passage just quoted. He in effect says that a portrait (for example, Lehrer's self-portrait MetaMe) presents a way of thinking about the person portrayed. (One valuable feature of the book is that Lehrer has set up a website with images of many of the artworks that he discusses.) A person viewing the portrait may adopt this way of thinking about the person. This is a perfectly sensible thing to say, but it hardly bears on the mind-body problem.

In the final chapter of the book, Lehrer writes that he did not set out to create a philosophical system, but found he did so. He calls his philosophical system "loop theory." The objective of loop theory "is to maximize explanation." It is designed to tie together Lehrer's reflections on "consciousness, representation, autonomy, knowledge, and art" (p. 173) in a more general theory. The basic idea is that all of our theories (of consciousness, art, and so on) form a comprehensive theory. The truth of this theory needs to be explained. We cannot, according to Lehrer, get outside of our theories, so the explanation must come from within the theory: it is provided by a sub-theory, which Lehrer calls the "truth theory." This sub-theory enables our comprehensive theory to "loop back onto itself and explain why it is true." (p. 174) (The concept of exemplarization is used to tie experience into the loop. As I have already indicated, I find it difficult to see how an experience, which cannot be captured in propositional terms, can be part of a theory.)

The core of the truth theory Lehrer calls the T principle. We get this principle by reflecting

that a person who obtains knowledge from what he accepts must be trustworthy in what he accepts, by which I mean he must be worthy of his own trust in what he accepts, and his trustworthiness must be successfully truth connected. (p. 180)

So the T principle is that each of us is trustworthy and our trustworthiness leads us to form true beliefs. This principle is supposed to be supported by our success in developing true theories. It in turn explains how we are successful in developing theories. I will not discuss this argument in any detail, but Lehrer notes that, "The loop cannot prove the skeptic is wrong . . . for it begs the question against the skeptic." (p. 181)

Art, Self and Knowledge was cobbled together from twelve of Lehrer's recent essays. This fact goes some measure of the way towards explaining why the book is so repetitive and why it touches upon so many different issues (not all of which can be discussed in a short review). However, it fails to explain why the book is so poorly written and certainly does not excuse the long opaque passages. Nor can it excuse the sloppy argumentation.