Articulating a Thought

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Eli Alshanetsky, Articulating a Thought, Oxford University Press, 2019, 164pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198785880.

Reviewed by Matt Weiner, University of Vermont


Eli Alshanetsky has written a valuable and original study of a phenomenon that is familiar to us all, but that has received little scrutiny in recent analytic philosophy: putting our thoughts into words. Sometimes articulating our thoughts is easy; they come to mind as sentences of the language we speak. But other times finding words for our thoughts is a struggle. It is these hard cases that Alshanetsky focuses on, where we seem to have a thought that we must work to formulate, and then we arrive at a formulation that we recognize as capturing the original thought.

As Alshanetsky argues in Chapter 1, much of the philosophical literature on self-knowledge focuses on cases in which the thinker can easily state their thought. On introspective theories (such as Locke's) we can simply perceive what we think; on other theories such as that of Burge (1996), we can know our thoughts non-observationally; on transparency models such as that of Moran (2001), we come to know what we think by coming to have that thought, as we learn what we think about a proposition by deliberating over its truth. None of these theories can easily account for cases where our own thoughts seem opaque to us. Alshanetsky gives the example of a seminar participant who is struck by an objection that they cannot immediately put into words. Writing down the objection is a lengthy process, full of false starts and difficulties, but eventually the participant arrives at a form of words that they can recognize as expressing the objection that they had had all along. Theories on which we have an immediate entitlement to self-knowledge cannot explain why knowledge of one's own thought is so difficult in this case. The problem is to explain both why articulation can be difficult and how it is possible.

Chapter 2 presents the puzzle about articulation that occupies most of the book. This puzzle is like the Meno puzzle about inquiry, in which searching for something requires knowing what it is we are searching for, which in turn (so Meno argued) means that we must already know the thing that we mean to learn through inquiry. We do not seem to be able to articulate a thought without knowing what thought it is that we are articulating, but if we know what thought it is that we are articulating, it seems as though we have already articulated it. Alshanetsky frames this as a triad:

1. You can often (sometimes readily and sometimes with difficulty) articulate the thought that p.

2. Coming to know the correct words (that is, the ones that would express your thought) requires knowing what you are thinking (that is, knowing that you are thinking that p), and having the latter knowledge before successfully completing the articulation.

3. And yet, you cannot know what you are thinking without coming to know the correct words. (p. 29)

Theses 2 and 3 do not apply to all thoughts. Our most transparent thoughts may arrive already formulated, as when I see a cat and at that moment say "There's a cat." Thesis 2 would not apply to such thoughts, since I do not know that I am thinking that there is a cat before finding those words. On the other hand, we may sometimes know what we are thinking without having words for it, so that thesis 3 fails; Alshanetsky gives the example of a mathematician thinking in pictures. Yet in hard cases like the case of the inarticulate seminar participant, the thought seems to be present before the words in which it is articulated, and the thinker does not have a non-verbal way of knowing exactly what they are thinking. In these cases theses 1-3 form an apparent inconsistent triad.

Chapter 3 considers deflationist accounts that reject thesis 1, that in the cases under consideration we are truly articulating a preexisting thought that p. Rather, on the deflationist views, the thought that p does not truly come into existence before it is articulated. What was present before the thought was articulated was not yet a fully formed thought. On a moderate deflationist view, what was present was a specification of some features that the thought we seek must have (that it is an objection to the seminar speaker's view, that it exploits a tension in a certain claim, etc.), and we feel that we have articulated the thought once we arrive at a formulation that meets this specification. On a radical deflationist view, we begin by embarking on a project to formulate a thought without aiming to meet any determinate criteria.

Alshanetsky argues that these deflationist views do not capture how our original thought constrains our articulations. We recognize the correct formulation of a thought by recognizing that it captures that thought in particular, rather than meeting a checklist or fulfilling an intellectual project. In the course of articulating our original objection to the seminar speaker, we might come to state other objections that met any criteria that we could have specified or that fulfill any intellectual project that we would have embarked on, while still recognizing that these were not our original objections. So there must indeed have been an unarticulated thought that we eventually manage to express with a formulation that p.

Alshanetsky then turns to the question of how our unarticulated thought enables us to recognize the words that properly formulate it. What enables us to accept or reject certain formulations as expressing our thought? Chapter 4 critically addresses the theory that our acceptance or rejection is grounded in reasons somehow provided by the thought. One such account is what Alshanetsky calls an Aristotelian theory, on which we have incomplete knowledge of what the original thought is, which we flesh out through a process of inquiry. We might begin by knowing what our thought was about, and certain relations it had to other thoughts, and some facts about what it concerned. From these facts we come to know what our thought was by drawing inferences about what this thought could be. Another possibility is a "Socratic" account on which articulation is a process of reminding ourselves of some formulation that we were aware of all along, or that synthesizes some information that we were already in possession of but had not put together in this form.

Alshanetsky objects that these views best describe some process other than articulation. The Aristotelian account best describes reconstructing a thought that we once had and have forgotten, while the Socratic account best describes finding new ways of expressing a thought that we have already formulated, as opposed to finding an initial formulation for an opaque thought. Whatever enables us to evaluate formulations of a thought, it will not be some explicit knowledge of what that thought is.

In Chapter 5, the central chapter of the book, Alshanetsky presents his positive account of articulation. As on the reasons theory, articulation is a way of moving from one form of knowledge of our thought to another form; but we are moving from implicit knowledge of the thought to explicit knowledge. Our thought is encoded with a signature that enables us to reidentify it, which will typically be accompanied by some explicit information concerning the thought. The moderate deflationist's specification of the thought we seek and the Aristotelian's knowledge of aspects of the thought might both draw on this explicit information. Yet the explicit information does not exhaust our implicit knowledge of the thought, and so the thought constrains our recognition of an adequate formulation in ways that go beyond what we could have inferred from the explicit information.

Alshanetsky explains the explicit and implicit aspects of our knowledge of a thought by an analogy with color perception. When I see a particular shade of a red, I can explicitly express various things about it; that it is a dark red, that it is the color of one of my shirts, and so on. But this does not exhaust my knowledge of this particular shade of red, which I perceive with a specificity that goes beyond what that explicit knowledge expresses. I may be able to recognize that shade of red again based on my perception of that particularity, and even to distinguish it from another shade of red that falls under all the things I explicitly know about this shade. My ability to reidentify this shade is not based on reasoning from my explicit knowledge of it; rather it is a recognitional capacity.

So with thoughts, our ability to recognize a formulation as expressing a thought comes from an ability to recognize the thought rather than inference from our explicit knowledge of the thought. Once we have successfully put the thought into words, we will be able to identify those words as a representation of the signature of the thought. But the way the thought initially struck us was more perceptual than verbal; we perceived the flaw in the speaker's argument rather than reasoning to it. So, as the explicit information of a color we are seeing need not determine the exact shade we are seeing, the explicit information we have about the thought need not contain enough information to determine a verbal formulation.

Alshanetsky sees the process of arriving at the articulation itself as combining sub-personal and personal mental processes. In the puzzling cases of articulation, an unconscious thought process "delivers words that strike us as pertinent to the thought to some extent" (p. 104). A personal, conscious process of finding words would either be insufficient to determine the content of the thought (as in the views discussed in chapter 4) or would be subject to the paradox that we could not get it started without having already articulated the content of the thought. But viewing the process of finding words as subpersonal rather than a process of reasoning avoids the paradox by denying thesis 2 of the triad; coming to know the correct words does not require us to have articulated what we are thinking, because the words derive from the unarticulated thought by a process that is not fully under conscious control.

Our conscious contribution to the process is at first one of trial and error, in which we attempt to spark the subpersonal process that will produce a satisfactory expression of the thought. Once that process is underway, we experience it as a personal process because it is a free expression of our thought. As with Hurthouse's account of spontaneous expressions of emotion (Hursthouse 1991), we neither engage in means-end reasoning concerning what the expression of the thought must be, nor do we feel the thought as a constraint. Our expression is free in that it is "unimpeded by any internal censorship or constraint" (p. 107).

Chapter 6 extends the account of articulation to a discussion of how reasoning might be involved in articulating thoughts. While articulating a thought we can make certain judgments about our attempts to articulate it, for instance that a certain formulation fails to capture the thought in a certain way. Alshanetsky argues that this is normatively constrained, but it is not a form of reasoning that is syllogistic or based on our explicit information about the unarticulated thought. It is more like a recognitional judgment, in which our implicit knowledge of the signature of the unarticulated thought allows us to perceive our attempts as matching the thought or not.

To raise a critical point, Alshanetsky's view relies on there being a determinate thought that comes to mind at the moment that our unarticulated thought strikes us. The cases in which the determinate thought is most readily grasped are those where a thought comes to us fully articulated and we struggle to find another way of putting it into words, as when I try to find the French words for "The cat jumps," or when I try to explain the thought "Names are rigid designators" to an audience who is not familiar with modal logic. These cases are not Alshanetsky's target, as our explicit knowledge of such thoughts contains everything we need to know in order to articulate them. There are also cases in which the formulation that I eventually recognize as expressing what I was trying to say goes beyond what I was thinking. Suppose I learn a formal system that allows me to state something that I recognize as a precise expression of an inchoate thought I had previously had. Surely the formalization brings something new to my old thought, whatever it was; I did not know the formal system before, so I could not have had it in mind. Alshanetsky's target is intermediate cases, where I have no way of expressing my initial thought, and yet the articulation I eventually arrive at does express precisely the thought that I had. And one might worry, with the deflationist, that the cases in which the original thought cannot be verbalized at all are exactly the cases in which the articulation expresses something that was not in the original thought.

That said, Alshanetsky has made major contributions to an original and difficult project. There is little enough literature on articulating opaque thoughts that he has had to formulate the puzzle and the views that he rejects as well as developing his own view. Yet the phenomenon of articulation is common enough, and important enough to our thinking, that his in-depth treatment is most welcome. Alshanetsky has done valuable work in exploring it in such depth, and anyone working in this area will need to give his work serious consideration.


Burge, T. (1996). Our Entitlement to Self-Knowledge. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 96: 91-116.

Hursthouse, R. (1991). Arational Actions. Journal of Philosophy 88, 57-68.

Moran, R. A. (2001). Authority and Estrangement: An Essay on Self-Knowledge. Princeton: Princeton University Press.