Articulating Medieval Logic

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Terence Parsons, Articulating Medieval Logic, Oxford University Press, 2014, 331pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199688845.

Reviewed by Mary Sirridge, Louisiana State University


This book is a fine contribution to the growing literature on medieval logic. It is shaped by a modern agenda: to determine how well the elaborate medieval logical problem-solving machinery can be understood in terms of modern logic and linguistics and how well the medieval system measures up with respect to its expressive potential, i.e., how many of the inferences and patterns of reasoning we are interested in can be captured using the resources of these systems and how many of the decisions about truth and validity these systems turn out can be shown to follow coherently from the basic principles of the system. Terence Parsons' conclusions are that with the addition of a widely used theory of anaphoric pronouns medieval logic is "similar to the predicate calculus in richness and power" (p. 4), and that the theorems of the system can be rigorously derived from a small number of rules and axioms and supplied with systematic semantic assignments in a way that shows that the majority of medieval logicians' decisions about truth and validity turn out to be sustainable.

The shape of Parsons' project will not be much of a surprise to anyone who has encountered his work on Meinong and Frege. The aim is to determine whether the system is consistent and complete and how and what it can express if the various pieces are rigorously interconnected -- by clarifying and revising (and sometimes supplying) definitions of operators and operations, imposing a well-defined and unambiguously interpreted canonical syntax and formation rules, making axioms and rules of derivation explicit, and systematically doing the derivations.

In the case of medieval logic, this project is guided by objectives most medieval logicians would not have understood (determining completeness) and must in many cases supply derivations for operations they usually took for granted (detachment, conversion). Frequently the check on whether Parsons' reconstruction "tracks" medieval theory is whether the inferences the reconstruction shows to be valid are the ones a medieval theorist accepted, whether the derivations seem to match how a medieval logician thought some problem through, and whether the same propositions come out false and true in the reconstruction as in the medieval theory. For example, in discussing John Buridan's view that the propositions with which he is dealing, even ones like 'Every farmer which owns a donkey owns an animal' (p. 189), have subject+predicate structure -- with the result that in this case the subject of the proposition is 'farmer which owns a donkey' -- Parsons notes that Buridan is pretty much content with analyzing particular cases, often with very little argument; Parsons says of his own procedure:

I will not try to review the reasoning that he gives (I find much of it inconclusive). Instead, I will try to give a precise account of a method that agrees with his classifications, and then compare the results of applying this method with his own judgments in the cases that he discusses. (p. 165)

I have been talking easily about "the medieval system" and "medieval logic". Articulating Medieval Logic (AML) is not a representation or reconstruction of any particular logician's views. It is an assessment of the resources of this way of doing logic and philosophy of language, sometimes pulling from one logician, sometimes from another. There is a wealth of textual material from individual medieval logicians, chiefly in the notes. For example, the note supporting the view that a sentence with an intransitive verb like 'Brownie runs' can be treated as consisting of subject+copula+participle ('Brownie is a running-thing') quotes good sized bits of Paul of Venice, John Buridan, and Albert of Saxony. But nobody, I think, would succeed in putting together a coherent picture of any given medieval logician's approach, even by systematically collecting all the textual material in all the notes (it could be collected, since the index systematically indicates all the pages on which a given logician is discussed or quoted). A partial exception is John Buridan. An entire section of Ch. 6 is devoted to Buridan's view that even very complex categorical propositions need to be analyzed as having subject+predicate structure, which is central to his logical theory.

AML starts, to be sure, with an account of Aristotle's logic as medieval logicians received and developed it; but is not a history of the development of medieval logic. Individual logicians are cited and quoted on the basis of whether they have something to say on the topic under discussion without regard to their dates; a note on supposition quotes William of Sherwood, Albert of Saxony, Marsilius of Inghen, Paul of Venice, Peter of Spain, Walter Burley, and William of Ockham -- in that order. Nor, despite devoting a good deal of attention to constructions and word order and determinations of the scope of operators, is AML a study of the various extensions and applications of medieval logical theories, e.g., sophisms (logical and grammatical puzzles) and obligations (logically shaped debate exercises). Some areas of interest in medieval logic naturally lie outside the scope of AML's investigation, e.g., insolubles (semantic and other paradoxes) and medieval discussions of self-reference and related phenomena generally. Consequences (meta-principles of propositional logic) and systems of modal and tense logic are discussed mainly in the context of ampliation and restriction, i.e., in terms of how these operators affect the reference of denoting expressions in a proposition. Another choice is to use only medieval logical texts that are available in English translation. (This last choice is less limiting than it might seem; the last forty years have seen the publication of a number of medieval logical works in English.[1])

One of the chief difficulties in presenting medieval logic to modern readers is that it is conducted almost entirely in a natural language, Latin, albeit a somewhat artificial Latin. The syntactic possibilities of Latin are used to display the logical structure of propositions and inferences. As Parsons puts it, "So this is a version of logic in which there is no logical form except for grammatical form." (p. 3) A major difference between medieval logical theories and the familiar modern quantified predicate calculus with identity is that, developing as it does out of Aristotle's syllogistic logic and following his lead, medieval logic thinks of all propositions that do not contain a logical connective as "categorical," i.e., as having subject+predicate structure, so that the subject of 'Every blue horse is an animal' is 'blue horse' -- with the result that the proposition will be false on account of having an empty subject term if there are no blue horses.

To reflect these characteristics of medieval logical thinking, and to take account of the fact that Latin can make distinctions between, say, 'Socrates sees some horse' and 'Some horse sees Socrates' by marking the different logical roles of 'Socrates' with case endings, and can thus use word order flexibly to indicate logical structure, Parsons devises "Linguish" to express these sentential structures. "I call the sentential structures with the roles indicated . . . logical forms. These logical forms are meant to underlie actual sentences of Latin with the indicated grammatical structure." (p. 83) Linguish is the system of these logical forms; and it is, Parsons says, essential to his enterprise "that a logical form of Linguish is transformable into a unique actual sentence of Latin of the sort that medieval logicians discuss." (p. 84) Thus 'Some horse sees Socrates' (Aliquis equus Sortem videt) comes out:

(some horseδ) (Socratesε) δ sees ε

(in AML logical forms are always bolded.) We get to the actual Latin sentence from its Linguish representation and vice versa by well-defined intermediate steps, in this case: Some horse Socratesacc sees (the intermediate steps are always italicized.) Linguish can get a lot more complicated. For example, once we add complex terms to basic categorical forms, as medieval logicians rapidly came to do, we get logical forms like:

(Socratesδ) (Some {donkey whichα (every animalβ) α sees β }γ) δ strikes γ

(Socrates strikes some donkey which sees every animal) by way of the intermediates: Socrates strikes some donkey which sees every animalacc and Socrates some donkeyacc which every animalacc sees strikes. As a rule, in AML the logical forms of Linguish are followed directly by English translations or by some intermediate step that is close to the English surface. The formation and derivation rules of the logical system apply to sentences of Linguish, as does the system of semantic assignments.

AML covers an enormous number of topics, often interconnected in an interesting way, and there is no brief way to give accounts of them all. The chapters are: 1. An Overview of Aristotelian Logic as seen by Medieval Logicians, 2. Aristotle's Proofs of Conversion and Syllogisms, 3. Quantifying Predicates, Singular Term Predicates, and Negative Terms, 4. Linguish (formation rules, translation procedures to and from Linguish, signification and supposition defined, truth conditions and validity, and completeness for the expanded Aristotelian system), 5. Expanding the Notation (adjectives, intransitive verbs, transitive verbs, additional rules for parasitic terms, complex terms, relative clauses, genitives, demonstratives, molecular propositions), 6. Relational expressions (relational verbs, parasitic terms, e.g., 'head of an animal', Buridan on Subjects and Predicates, Simple and Complex terms), 7. Modes of personal supposition (refined modes: wide and narrow scope distributive supposition, modes of supposition as analyses of quantification, global quantificational import), 8. Relatives (Anaphora), 9. Comparison of Medieval Logic with Contemporary Logic (the expressive power of medieval logic, representing medieval logic within modern predicate logic with identity, representing modern logic within medieval logic: existential import, first-order arithmetic in medieval logic), 10. Ampliation and Restriction (tenses, Buridan on appellation, modal expressions, semantic words like 'conceive' and 'signify'), and an Appendix: Artificial Quantifiers in 16th Century Logic.

In chapters 1 and 2 Parsons presents Aristotelian syllogistic logic, attempting to be faithful to Aristotle's intent and procedures, but at the same time anticipating the role of Aristotle's theory as the foundation of medieval logic. For example with respect to existential import, Parsons opts for the interpretation most medieval theorists would accept; and medieval nomenclature and schemata are already much in evidence. Chapter 2 ends with a brief and amusing explanation of Peter of Spain's explanation of the familiar mnemonic verse for remembering valid syllogistic forms. Chapter 3 is already a presentation of the additions to Aristotelian logic medieval logicians would have taken for granted by the 1200's: categorical propositions with singular predicates, quantified predicates, and "infinitizing negation," e.g., 'Some non-donkey is some stone'. Chapter 4, in which Linguish is introduced, introduces validity for the expanded system and ends with a demonstration that the expanded Aristotelian-style system is complete: "the rules we have proposed are adequate to provide derivations for all valid arguments." (p. 113)

Chapter 7 contains Parsons' presentation of a common 14th century theory of the modes (or divisions) of "personal supposition" for common terms; these modes deal, e.g., with the reference of 'donkey' in 'Every donkey is spotted' and 'Some animal is a donkey' and the resulting inferential relationships among the categorical proposition. The supposition of a term in a proposition has to do, roughly, with which of the entities signified by the term it stands for at the time at which the proposition is spoken or entertained. Terms are subordinated to concepts, so that at a given time a term signifies those entities (if any) that its concept picks out at that time. (pp. 95-97) Much of Parsons' discussion efficiently covers familiar ground; some of the material he has presented elsewhere.[2] Of particular interest here is his proposal, p. 209ff., that the traditional theory of distributive supposition be refined by distinguishing between wide distributive supposition (from 'Every donkey is running' we can infer the conjunction 'This donkey is running and that donkey is running and so on for all the donkeys' and vice versa) and narrow distributive supposition (from 'Some philosopher is not a vegetarian' we can infer 'Some philosopher is not this vegetarian and some philosopher is not that vegetarian, and so on for all the vegetarians', but not vice versa). The distinction is not explicit among logicians of the 14th century, but Parsons provides some evidence (pp. 214-218) that the two modes of distribution are in effect being used by Buridan and William of Sherwood.

Less familiar ground than the theory of supposition[3] and of considerable importance for Parsons' own agenda is his treatment of "relatives" (roughly modern-day anaphora.) He quite sensibly sets aside the "relative of diversity" (A man and another man are running) and the "relative of accident" (Socrates is such as Plato is). There is a fair amount of material about these varieties of relatives in medieval logic, and even more in medieval grammar, but they are peripheral to Parsons' main point, which is that anaphora bring fairly complex possibilities of variable-binding and cross-reference into the system. 'Every man saw a horse which saw him' comes into Linguish as:

(Every manα)i(∙{horse whichγ (itiβ) γ saw β}δ) α saw δ

(not surprisingly, indexing, indicated by superscripting, has entered the notation system.)

A very important provision of the medieval theory of relatives is, as Parsons translates it, "singled supposition" (singulatio) for reflexive pronouns, which allows us to infer 'Socrates sees himself' and 'Socrates sees Socrates' from 'Every man sees himself', but not 'Every man sees Socrates' or 'Plato sees Socrates'. Most medieval logicians recognize this rule as a matter of course, and Parsons' translation reflects the reason: the provision allows us to keep the general rule that relatives of identity inherit their reference from their antecedents -- but singled (singillatim) Parsons has a good discussion of how the inheritance rule is understood; as Parsons remarks (p. 240) it is difficult to determine precisely where Burley and Ockham stand on the relationship between antecedent and relative, but Buridan and many logicians who follow him accept the rule that 'he' in a sentence like 'A man runs and he is white' stands for the men of which the clause containing the antecedent 'man' is true, i.e., for running men. Singulation can be extended, as Parsons says, to examples like 'A man is a donkey or he is a man', and he presents evidence that some late medieval logicians took this approach to such examples. (pp. 244-45) There is also a lot of evidence that medieval logicians accepted as valid syllogisms with no universal premises -- so long as the minor premise has a relative expression, e.g., 'A man is white, and that man is running, therefore a running thing is white', which is accepted by Buridan. (p. 252) There's less evidence that medieval logicians accepted Parsons' suggestion for handling examples like 'Every man runs and he is Socrates' by letting 'every man' range over the second conjunct and bind 'he'. Still, Burley deals with this case (p. 249), as do other medieval logicians; Parsons' proposal produces decisions about truth and validity, which in the main match theirs; and this approach brings Parsons' medieval-style system much closer to the quantified predicate calculus. The treatment of relatives ends with a short discussion of donkey anaphora and relatives of sameness and diversity.

Parsons has succeeded in giving a unified account of a large segment of medieval logic, and one that allows an assessment of the resources of this method of doing logic. AML is, I suspect, going to be the object of ongoing assessment and debate. Linguish is probably not going to replace working in medieval Latin for those accustomed to doing so; it may well not replace modern predicate logic as a way of understanding medieval logic for those who are accustomed to doing that. The learning curve for Linguish and Parsons' system of derivation[4] and his treatment of truth conditions is steep. But precisely because it is so systematically related to the actual structure of the Latin used by medieval logicians, the system is a powerful tool for analyzing arguments and explaining decisions about truth and falsity and validity that a medieval author drops into his discussion without explanation, and for testing some convoluted arguments in medieval Latin that are just very hard to think through. Parsons' system is probably going to be appreciated by anyone who has ever had to wrestle a refractory Latin argument into the quantified predicate calculus with identity. And it seems to me that it is likely to be a very accurate way, historically speaking, of introducing (very) logically literate philosophers to medieval logic. (In section 9.3, "Representing modern logic within medieval logic: The problem of existential import," and 9.4 "Representing modern logic within medieval logic: Grammatical issues" Parsons gives a brief, helpful account of the difficulties that turn up when one is making the transition from medieval logic to modern logic and the other way around, and a detailed procedure for "converting any formula of modern logic (without names, for simplicity) into one in the medieval logic notation which is logically equivalent to it." (p. 267)) As a side benefit, Parsons' development of Linguish as a systematic representation of the logical forms of Latin sentences and his presentation of formation rules for Linguish, procedures for getting to and from the corresponding Latin sentences, and rules of derivation is, so far as I can tell, immaculate, a real pleasure to read.

It would have been helpful if the precedent of ending a chapter with a summary of the rules of proof introduced in the chapter (pp. 53-55, 77-80) had been followed in subsequent chapters, and better yet if there were a comprehensive list at the end of the book (the rules of proof are, however, invariably clearly displayed in boxes at the point at which they are introduced.) The index gives an adequate list of figures cited and quoted, but the entries for topics are scanty; the reader will usually look in vain for the names of operations and principles -- or, for that matter, for 'Linguish'. AML does, however, give a liberal supply of very helpful "applications," i.e., exercises in translation and derivation that a person ought to be able to do after another reading or so of the preceding material. I would have appreciated an answer key, and would gladly have promised to look at the answers only after having made a good faith effort to carry out the derivations myself.

[1] In addition to translated material in scholarly articles, cf. William of Sherwood, William of Sherwood's Introduction to Logic, trans. Norman Kretzmann, University of Minnesota Press, 1966; William of Ockham, Ockham's Theory of Terms: Part I of the Summa Logicae, trans. Michael Loux, University of Notre Dame Press, 1974; Summa Logicae, Part II, trans. Alfred Freddoso and Henry Shuurman, University of Notre Dame Press, 1980; Marsilius of Inghen, Treatises on the Properties of Terms, trans. Egbert Bos, Reidel, 1983; various logical texts in Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump, The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, vol. 1, Cambridge University Press, 1988; Walter Burley, On the Purity of the Art of Logic, trans. Paul Spade, Yale University Press, 2000; John Buridan, Summulae de Dialectica, trans. Gyula Klima, Yale University Press, 2001; Peter of Spain, Summaries of Logic: Text, Translation, Introduction, and Notes, trans. Brian Copenhaver with Calvin Normore and Terence Parsons, Oxford, 2014; John Buridan, Treatise on Consequences, trans. Stephen Read, Fordham University Press, 2015.

[2] Terence Parsons, "The Doctrine of Distribution," Journal of History and Philosophy of Logic 27 (1): 59-74; "The Development of Supposition Theory in the Later 12th through 14thCenturies," in Handbook of the History of Logic: Medieval and Renaissance Logic, vol. 2, ed. Gabbay, D. and Woods, J., Elsevier: 2008.

[3] The exceptions are Reinhard Hülsen, Zur Semantik Anaphorischer Pronomina: Untersuchungen scholastischer und moderner Theorien, E.J. Brill, 1994; "Understanding the Semantics of 'relativa grammaticalia': Some Medieval Logicians on Anaphoric Pronouns" in Reference and Anaphoric Relations," ed. K. von Heusinger and U. Egli, Kluwer, 2000. Cf. also Gyula Klima, "General Terms and Their Referring Function," in Ars Artium: Essays in Philosophical Semantics, Medieval and Modern. Budapest, 1988, 74-82; John Buridan. Oxford University Press, 2009, 128-133.

[4] The derivation system is reminiscent of Logic: Techniques of Formal Reasoning, Donald Kalish and Richard Montague, Harcourt, Brace, World: 1964.