Artifice and Design: Art and Technology in Human Experience

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Barry Allen, Artifice and Design: Art and Technology in Human Experience, Cornell UP 2008, 213pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780801446825.

Reviewed by David Goldblatt, Denison University



Barry Allen’s new book is unusual in its enormous chronological scope and its vast geographical coverage. Artifice and Design: Art and Technology in Human Experience takes us from the Upper Paleolithic Age to the present time and from East Africa to the lifelines of Manhattan. To say that it is interdisciplinary is to understate his attempt to be everywhere academically. Allen turns to “evolutionary biology, cognitive psychology, science studies, aesthetics, and the history, philosophy, and anthropology of art and technology” to put in place his panoramic thesis. In its refusal to accept widely accepted views, Artifice and Design is as stubborn as it is provocative. Disagreement with Allen on the history and conceptual analysis of humanity’s relationship to art and artifice should not prevent strong praise for his undertaking.

So what is it about? Allen claims that the civilization that best manages its technology, the society of well-made works, must include the humanizing appeal of art — a consideration of aesthetics. Beginning before the existence of what are believed to be the first tools and working up through the history of modern building and contemporary manufacturing, Allen insists that aesthetics, the way things look and feel, has been part of good design and, then, good engineering. Artifice, or workmanship, he says, is intimately connected to a work’s perceptual appeal. Whatever else is involved in putting something together, its success requires perceptual concern as well. And art is, or ought to be, not disinterested perception, not art for art’s sake, not exiled in museums or otherwise isolated from human life, but rather an integrated part of life, just as technology is irreversibly at one with how we live.

Allen is a contextualist. When we utilize and evaluate artifacts, cars for example, we must also consider their effects and recognize that smog too is an artifact whose history is at one with the history of the automobile. So artifacts can be coherent or incoherent with the motives that originated them. Talk about technology always includes talk about a tradition of design and an economy of a people. Designers of machines need to care about what happens to them when machines are no longer needed or when they stop working. When retired, can they be recycled or repaired, or will they simply be added to the accumulating world of trash? “Repair,” he says very nicely, “is a kind of care … Repair is a caring reply to skill’s art”.

Allen prefaces his discussion of technology with nothing less than speculations on the origins of knowledge. Knowledge, he claims, has little to do with the modern and contemporary epistemology of the epistemologists. For Allen, knowledge begins with doing something. The development of the brain in pre-human and early human evolution is an effect of the development of hands — hands doing work, making things, rather than the other way around. The distinction between knowing how and knowing that collapses at the gradual emergence of our species some 60,000 years ago in Africa, which was already “saturated” with a diversity of tools going back some two million years before that. Quite reasonably “tool” has a wide denotation in this book — not stone instruments alone, but fire, clothing, and some form of language are tools as well as artifacts. Some are intangible, like position in space, as with the layout of a blacksmith shop. But at the outset of Homo sapiens we have the beginning of tool-making perhaps with the Acheulian teardrop-shaped stone tools of Africa.

Allen writes extensively about tools: what they are and what they aren’t. He is nearly obsessive about insisting that animals, like chimpanzees that use sticks to fish for termites, are not using tools. Tools are collaborators, but they are not found objects — they are the consequences of other tools and so a link in a chain of designed manufacturing. Tools facilitate and amplify action and they too, having been made, are economic artifacts made, Allen says, “the way they were supposed to look.”

Tools, according to Allen, are functionless — even with respect to the function for which they were initially designed. In that respect, as in others, Allen is no essentialist. It is we, "the human," who use tools in certain ways, thus giving them functions by virtue of that use. He thinks that in order to better understand technology and risk it is important to understand that tools in themselves have no function. This claim is part of his appreciation of technological uncertainty and his recognition that both simple and complex machines, through their interfacing, change their uses and so their functions. The stone I pick up in the forest and use as a hammer is not a tool, he says, but a proto-tool. Chimpanzees and other animals do use proto-tools — found objects. But these are not part of an economy as Allen says tools must be. The only tools are human tools.

Then there are quasi-tools, which are only “thin and unilluminating” in their analogy with the tools humans use. What makes them quasi, Allen says, is that behaviors with them “lack individual variation, improvisation, or intelligent accommodation to circumstance.” They are, typically, “a species-specific adaptation for feeding — an instinct with limited flexibility, rather than an outcome of learning, intelligence, and dexterity.”

One of the outstanding discussions in Art and Design, in which some of Allen’s more speculative analyses hit home, is about bridges. Here, Allen takes us through a variety of types — engineering choices from a few diverse site-specific circumstances. It is in his brief survey of the structural types of bridges that Allen best illustrates the aesthetics of artifacts: what makes a bridge good or bad and how the best bridges include the need for a positive perceptual appeal. The dramatic Valtschielbach Bridge in Donath, Switzerland (1925) designed by Robert Maillart, is a prime case of an excellent structural solution and a beautiful span which, by virtue of its ingenuity, was economical to build and hence a competitive bid. There, the traffic deck is not simply supported by the arch. It is an integral member of it, accounting for a bridge that has less dead weight and resulting in an elegant structure that makes “the flow of forces” a conspicuous fascinating form. Structural innovation, Allen says, merges here with aesthetic accomplishment.

By contrast with Maillart’s bridge, the Lansdowne Bridge on the Indus at Sukkur, in Pakistan (1889) by Alexander Rendel is an example of “insipid, even crude engineering” resulting in a “monstrosity” of a technically correct structure and an unmotivated, aesthetic failure. Subsequent discussions include spans connecting New York City to the rest of the world. They include the Brooklyn Bridge, the Bayonne, the George Washington and the Hell Gate Bridge. Allen adds to the notion of a factor like stability aesthetic predicates like visual stability and visual equilibrium, which in his mind justify extraneous and unnecessary aspects of construction for perceptual appeal alone.

An interesting aside in the discussion of New York river crossings is Allen’s comments on the Holland Tunnel (1927) under the Hudson River, connecting Manhattan and New Jersey. Thanks to the solution of a new system of ventilation, the Holland Tunnel (designed by Clifford Holland) became the first major tunnel for automobile traffic. Allen thinks of that tunnel as an instance of the principle that something too big like the Erie Canal or too small like a grain of sand cannot be experienced aesthetically. Unlike a bridge, the Holland Tunnel cannot be perceived in its entirety (one cannot stand back and see the tunnel) and so, Allen says, the tunnel “lacks an aesthetic presence.” At best, this is a half truth, as Allen forgets the aesthetic presence of being in motion through its white tiled walls lit by fluorescents while knowing the awesome fact that one is disappearing beneath the Hudson; this passage is not unlike the way bridges are experienced by those driving across them, who miss only the postcard shots from some proper, carefully arranged distance.

When it comes to art, not to be confused with aesthetics, Allen discusses some of the expected concepts like the beautiful and the expressive and innovation, to which he does not give much weight. Somewhat cryptically, he reminds us of the proper placement of art in a culture of artifacts, by analogy:

Ontologically, works of art are more like weeds than parking tickets. Weeds are not merely conventional entities, like games, paper currency, or parking tickets. Yet there are no weeds in the primordial forest. Weeds exist because people plant crops. Art, like weeds, grow everywhere, yet only on ground broken out by cultivation.

But his attitude toward art is clearest when he turns his attention to Duchamp’s readymades, which he sees as the beginning of conceptual art. Allen fully admits that Duchamp’s work, like the marked urinal Fountain, which he exhibited in 1917, is art — irreversibly a part of art’s history but art only in a nominal sense. Of Duchamp and his controversial work there has already been a great deal written. This however, does not inhibit Allen from a scalding evaluation, of its damaging place in art history saying that Duchamp was the first important artist who was not an important painter, sculptor or the like. “(Wit) just isn’t enough for art”, he writes. One reason, for Allen’s criticism is that readymades are already made. The impact of the work of artists like Duchamp or Chris Burden, requires no hands-on technics. Their work is not dependent upon perceptual appeal (or so Allen thinks) — it is no visible contribution via craft as Michaelangelo or Leonardo’s art is. What makes Allen’s objections suspiciously inconsistent is his failure to take to task modernist abstract painters, some of whose work is equally unskilled in the relevant sense, some of whom are not chemists when it comes to making their painterly materials. Barnett Newman, the abstract field painter, was reputed to have informed those wanting to film him painting that it would be like watching someone paint a fence. However, the perceptual aspects of conceptual art, at least in most cases, are not to be underestimated and the disturbance factor that is credited by Allen in the work of Picasso and other modernists, is certainly a factor for Duchamp. Happily, Allen is not an essentialist when it comes to art, but a full discussion of his objection to conceptualism, and its legacy for works like those of Andy Warthol, will have to await another occasion.

Allen can hardly be blamed for omissions in a book that covers so much intellectual territory. But the near absence of architecture (as well as the fact that he says little about computers — their own design and their role in designing) in a book on design and technology is glaring. A clarifying comparison with Le Corbusier’s Engineering Aesthetic, for example, might have been a welcome addition. In proposing his infamous and influential Engineer’s Aesthetic (1927), Corbusier says, “The Engineer, inspired by the law of Economy and governed by mathematical calculation, puts us in accord with universal law. He achieves harmony.” Corbusier sees the analog of the machine and its formal properties in the construction of industrial buildings, as a kind of truth — the elements of deceit prevalent in the contemporary architecture of his own time are absent in machines. In the machine, there is a tendency to build unadorned structures emphasizing form and expressing function — and so he, like Allen, foregrounds tools and bridges, but also steamships and airplanes, silos and Greek ruins.

To be clear: Allen’s book is a fascinating coming together of histories and theories, processes and projects, artifacts and other facts, artworks and other works. However, in the end, what is the message? For Allen, there isn’t the “tendency” we find in Corbusier — rather, the good and bad is more or less a matter of choice and possibility. Allen is aware, of course, that the design of artifacts that stand the structural and functional test of time can result in works that are not beautiful or expressive — works that lack perceptual appeal. He also realizes that there is no automatic relationship between goods that work and goods that look good. On the other hand, he claims that good engineering does produce works of aesthetic value because, otherwise, it would not be good in some broader sense, good for the life of community and culture, the daily quality of human experience. He says,

My thesis is that good technical design (good engineering) is at once aesthetic and structural or mechanical, that good design cares for the perceptual, human interface as much as the mechanical interface of parts and systems.

This, of course, is tautological: the aesthetic is analytic, given Allen’s idea of “good.” So again, what is Allen asking? It seems to me that Allen calls for responsibility among those who design, which is coupled with their understanding of design’s proper place in human experience. That is, Allen’s account is normative and his polemic appeals to cases that are aesthetically and technically successful, from the origins of the human species to the present, to show, often by way of illustration, that choices can be made that are fully good engineering and that if the obligation to build in that sense is abandoned, the consequences for our culture are severe.

Artifice and Design: Art and Technology in Human Experience contains an excellent choice of relevant illustrations. Allen has scattered throughout it a variety of his own gems — quips and witticisms — as well as a fine set of quotations from others. It should be of interest to those in as many fields as Allen brings together in his book. Allen writes this book with a fighting spirit not usually found in scholarly works. Again, it is the span of Artifice and Design, its scope and gathering, which sets it apart.