Artworld Metaphysics

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Robert Kraut, Artworld Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2007, 187pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199228126.

Reviewed by Robert Stecker, Central Michigan University


In this book, Robert Kraut raises a wide range of questions about the philosophical study of art. Some are highly methodological. What are the data that inform theory? What is the aim of aesthetic theory? Others seem more substantive. Does music express emotions? Do artworks have a single correct interpretation? Even these chapters in the end are more about the best strategy for answering questions than about how they should be answered. And even questions of methodology and strategy don't receive definitive answers. If you love to explore how you might go about answering philosophical questions, this book is for you. If you would like to see a philosophical theory about art laid out and defended, you should look elsewhere.

Here is an overview of the contents. Chapter 1 is about the nature of a philosophical theory about art, and how to make it non-dreary. Kraut claims that aesthetic theory has been dreary in the past because it has not clearly distinguished itself from art criticism, and so non-dreariness requires a clear distinction between the two. Aesthetic theory, he maintains, should classify and explain rather than evaluate and justify. Further, it should be based on adequate data, from creators, performers, and appreciators and from a wide array of genres within an art form in order to avoid aesthetic 'infractions' of artistic data.

Chapter 2 attempts to yoke together two disparate things. The chapter begins with the experience of playback: an artist listening to a recording of his performance and recognizing its flaws. This becomes a metaphor for distanced analytic theorizing and the adequacy of such theorizing to its object and to people's experience of it. The problem with using this metaphor is that the experience of playback is a species of art criticism -- the artist evaluating his performance -- the very thing that aesthetic theory needs to sharply distinguish itself from, according to the claim of Chapter 1. So the metaphor either undermines this claim or the claim undermines the metaphor. But this problem turns out not to matter. The chapter is really concerned with a type of theory: the 'inverted explanation'. Here is an example of such an explanation. We normally think that we condemn actions because they are wrong, but the inversionist asserts that they are wrong because they are condemned. The real burden of Chapter 2 is to claim that institutional theories of art are inversionist and inversionist theories are capable of being adequate to the data.

Chapter 3 completes the set of methodological chapters by asking why jazz matters to aesthetic theory. It should matter given another claim from Chapter 1, that an adequate data set requires information from a wide array of genres within an art form. It follows that jazz should provide important data not derivable from, say, classical music. It turns out though to be really hard to find a way jazz does matter, and it's not clear that Kraut discovers one.

Chapter 4 concerns whether music expresses emotion or possesses emotion-expressive properties. Kraut doubts this, but worries about the correct specification of what he is denying. There is no question that music arouses emotion in some listeners and reliably causes an experience of hearing a given emotion in the music. So we might say that music has the expressive property of sadness if the relevant class of listeners hear sadness in it or feel sadness when listening to it. Kraut concedes the music might have expressive properties in that sense. But other listeners (including Kraut himself) don't have these experiences. Is there a real property in the music they are missing? Kraut's central claim is that there isn't if the explanation for the difference in experience makes no reference to expressive properties.

The remaining chapters focus on the interpretation and ontology of art. What is in, or part of, an artwork? Chapter 5 asks: is this a question that needs answering before we can interpret the work or do we need an interpretation before we can answer the question? It also asks: what evidence should we appeal to in figuring out an answer to the initial question? Many possibilities are explored, but none are settled on. Kraut regards the initial question as an ontological one. But ontology is more commonly concerned with the kind of entities that there might be and with which of these the objects of discourse should be identified. On this understanding, whether a Duane Hanson sculptural installation includes an electrical outlet is not an ontological question, unlike the question whether it is a collection of physical objects.

Chapter 6 tackles the dispute between critical monists and pluralists. Its tentative and conditional conclusion is that, if the goal of interpretation is the explanation of artworld phenomena, monism is the way to go. Much of Chapter 7 is a reply to pragmatist, specifically Rortyan, attacks on the objectivity of interpretive claims, and on the usefulness of the concept of objectivity in general. But the end of the chapter reverts to a theme found throughout the book: the aim of ontological, and more generally, philosophical theories. A central theme has been that this aim is explanatory. It now turns out that while this can be true, it needn't be. Such theories can simply codify institutional norms, without explaining, much less justifying them.

There is much that I admired in this book, especially some of the detailed evaluation of arguments that can be found in nearly every chapter, especially those dealing with substantive issues. For example, Chapter 6, my favorite, contains excellent critiques of some arguments for critical pluralism -- the idea that there are several equally correct or acceptable but incompatible interpretations of a given artwork. Against this admiration, there was a more powerful feeling that this should have been a much better book. It is missing two things that would have made it better.

First there is far too little engagement with the recent literature in the philosophy of art on the topics central to these chapters -- interpretation, ontology, and expression. The book begins with the old complaint that aesthetics is dreary, but the fact is, it hasn't been dreary for some time now -- just the reverse. Further, what little engagement with recent literature there is tends to be superficial and puzzling. Consider what appears to be a bold claim, that some philosophers of art commit aesthetic 'infractions' by ignoring or riding roughshod over artworld practices. (18) For example, there is the datum that jazz musicians constantly refer to their music as a language, which stands in contrast to the claims of several philosophers that music is not a language. The contrast exists and needs explaining, but this does not show that there is anything wrong with the claims of either the musicians or the philosophers. I don't know how the musician's claims are best explicated, and never find out from Kraut. But the philosophers are denying that if music has meaning, it can be explicated as a species of linguistic meaning, a claim, it turns out, that Kraut seems largely to agree with for precisely the same theoretical reasons given by those philosophers. (58-59)

The other, even more important, thing missing from this book is sharper definitions of the theses it is attempting to defend. Are philosophical theories in the business of giving explanations? It seems so for most of the book (though it could be clearer what is being explained), until, in the last chapter, it turns out this need not be true. Does music lack expressive properties? It may not, if it turns out that those properties are not referenced in an explanation of the phenomenon of hearing emotion in music. Should we be critical monists or critical pluralists? We should be critical monists, if we want (and there are) explanations of the meaning of a work. Even critical pluralists will agree with that. Instead of defending a well defined thesis, each chapter tends to be an inconclusive exploration of alternatives. It considers many interesting possibilities, but settles on very few.