As Free and as Just as Possible: The Theory of Marxian Liberalism

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Jeffrey Reiman, As Free and as Just as Possible: The Theory of Marxian Liberalism, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 256pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780470674123.

Reviewed by David A. Reidy, University of Tennessee


The trouble with capitalism as we know it, argues Jeffrey Reiman, is that it organizes production around a form of property that enforces through structural coercion an unjust exchange of labor between workers and owners. This fact about capitalism as a mode of production is not obvious, for the unfairness in the exchange of labor lies beneath the surface phenomena we experience as individuals within a capitalist economy. At the surface and as individuals, whether as workers or owners, we experience an endless series of voluntary and mutually advantageous transactions, or at least we do or should when the laws governing force, fraud, duress, theft and so on are properly enforced. Nevertheless, beneath the surface and as generic or representative occupants of the social positions made available by the property relations that structure most if not all capitalist economies, we can see that the relationship between "worker," on the one hand, and "owner" or "capitalist," on the other, is best characterized as one of coercively imposed non-reciprocal advantage in the exchange of labor. The coercion here is structural or institutional. Structural or institutional coercion typically operates indirectly, but no less effectively for that, by arranging background conditions so as to fix or limit in advance the options, the potential transactions, available to individuals.

Coercion, structural or otherwise, is always a potential threat to liberty and so prima facie morally problematic on that front. But it need not be ultima facie morally problematic. For coercion can, all things considered, serve liberty. When it fairly or reciprocally serves the liberty of all subject to it, it is reasonable to suppose their consent to it. Coercion coupled with a reasonable expectation of consent poses, at least with respect to liberty, no moral problem.

No matter their form or structure, property regimes depend for their existence, Reiman argues, on structural or institutional coercion. It is reasonable to suppose the consent of all subject to a property regime, an institutionalized system of property relations, only if it fairly or reciprocally advances or improves liberty overall for each and all. The property regimes of all or nearly all existing capitalist states fail this test. But a reformed capitalism (capitalism here being understood rather loosely as involving private ownership of the means of production, firms engaged in a competitive struggle for profit, a labor market that affords firms substantial freedom to hire, fire and control terms of employment as dictated by considerations of efficiency and competitive advantage, and so on) would pass. Rawls's difference principle expresses the key reform required of capitalism. Interestingly, Reiman suggests that at this point in history, given the state of human productive capacities, a reformed capitalism faithful to the difference principle may be the only mode of production with a coercively maintained structure that may reasonably be expected to draw the consent of all those subject to it.

Reiman shares the traditional Marxist view that the property relations at the heart of capitalist economies as we find them in the world today fail to organize the exchange of labor so that it is reciprocally advantageous to each and all. But he offers a different account of this failure. On a traditional Marxist view, the problem with the property relations at the heart of capitalism is that they inevitably create a class, workers, without access to any means of production besides their labor. Workers must sell their labor power as a fungible commodity at market prices to those who own and control the means of production. Owners or capitalists are thereby enabled to capture any and all "surplus value" realized by the actual labor expended by workers and embodied in the commodities they produce. This coercively imposed one-directional flow of surplus value from the social position occupied by workers to the social position occupied by owners or capitalists explains, on a traditional Marxist view, what would otherwise be mysterious, namely the growth of capital over time, even when or if markets tend toward equilibrium with all commodities, including labor power, fetching, on average, only their real costs of production.

Of course, as soon as workers come to understand the truth about the property relations essential to capitalism, a truth established by way of the best explanation of a key feature of capitalism, namely the growth of capital over time, they can reasonably be expected to withdraw their consent to those relations. Getting workers to see this truth is no easy task. For it is obscured from easy view by the "bourgeois" liberal ideology of individual equal rights, including rights of property and contract. Indeed, on the traditional Marxist view, obscuring this truth from easy view is just what, as a tradition of political thought, liberalism is for. By obscuring from view the fact that essential to capitalism is a non-reciprocal exchange of surplus value between workers and owners or capitalists, liberalism makes it plausible to suppose that capitalism is something to which we can reasonably expect all involved, workers and owners or capitalists, to consent.

Reiman offers a different account of the structurally coerced non-reciprocal exchange of labor between workers and owners or capitalists. Unlike the traditional account just rehearsed, Reiman's account does not depend on Marx's labor theory of value as a theory of price formation. And unlike many Marxists, Reiman argues for the reform rather than the rejection of both capitalism and liberal political thought. He argues for a reformed capitalism that he hopes will be acceptable to Marxists and for an understanding of and commitment to communism that he hopes will be acceptable to liberals. He dubs his view Marxian liberalism. Marxian liberalism, a species of liberalism rather than Marxism, draws heavily from both Marx and Rawls without simply reproducing either.

After rehearsing some key ideas in Marx's and Rawls's thought (Chapter 2), Reiman begins to set out his account of Marxian liberalism. He takes as his point of departure a natural right to liberty (Chapter 3). This right does not entail or contain a natural right to property. Reiman is no "right libertarian." Nor does it suggest that in some sense the world is owned by everyone in common. Reiman is no "left libertarian" either. For Reiman, the natural right to liberty is simply a negative right to be free to act on one's choices, free of coercion that either one has not consented to or is not necessary to secure the natural liberty of others. It is grounded in each person's rational competence (assuming ordinary biological and psychological development and so on) to make correct or sound moral judgments and inferences. It entails that structurally coercive social institutions and relations must be vindicated by the consent of those subject to them. But actual consent is not required, for even if it were forthcoming it would itself need to be assessed against a standard of reasonableness to determine whether it was genuine. Reasonable hypothetical consent suffices.

The natural right to liberty leads naturally, then, to a hypothetical consent social contract approach to the justification of structurally coercive social institutions and relations. The social contract model Reiman proposes is Lockean insofar as it assumes a natural right to liberty antecedent to the contract but Rawlsian insofar as property rights emerge only as an outcome of the contract. Agents in Reiman's original position know that they have a natural right of liberty and so duties to others (of non-interference, for example) correlate with this right. But Reiman does not seem to think that committing the agents in his original position to this right requires of them any distinctive species of moral reasoning. Each reasons from her own point of view and in pursuit of her own interests, albeit constrained by the right of each and all to be free of coercion to which it would not be reasonable to consent. It is difficult to see how this does not constitute a species of moral reasoning, however, since agents must ask themselves what they can reasonably demand of one another. If there is any heuristic value derived, as in Rawls's version of the original position, from modeling separately our capacities to be reasonable (through the veil of ignorance, the formal conditions of right, etc.) and to be rational (through primary goods, the principles of rational choice, etc.), it would seem to be absent from Reiman's version of the original position argument. Indeed, Reiman's version risks conflating the point of view of those to whom an original position argument is addressed, you and me, with the point of view of those hypothetically situated as agents within it.

Both Reiman and Rawls manifestly mean to address their original position arguments to fellow citizens living within modern industrialized and more or less democratic societies. But Reiman's argument is addressed to those committed, as a matter of general moral theory, to the natural right to liberty. Rawls's argument, at least in the later work and arguably in the earlier work too, is addressed to those committed only more generally to a tradition of and self-understandings consonant with democratic thought and practice. It presupposes no commitment to a natural right to liberty. Arguably Rawls's argument is addressed to a wider section of fellow citizens. On Reiman's view, however, Rawls's argument fails insofar as it does not deliver, by Rawls's own admission, one of the conclusions it aims to establish, namely a decisive, ideally deductive, argument for the difference principle. Reiman argues that on this front his original position argument delivers where Rawls's does not.

To be sure, Reiman does not simply assume the natural right to liberty. But the argument seems to come down to this: under normal circumstances adults are capable of making sound or correct moral judgments and inferences and are thus independently responsible for the moral judgments and inferences they make. The law, moral philosophy and ordinary people in all known cultures assume as much. Hence, under normal circumstances adults have a right to act freely on their own choices unless they have consented to coercion or coercion is necessary to protect the right of others to so act. Now, the premises of this argument claim or assert nothing particularly controversial with respect to the basic moral capacities and status of adults under relatively favorable conditions (e.g., the absence of cultural or institutional forces disfiguring moral development, etc.). And one may move without too much difficulty from these capacities and this status to a number of further commitments, to certain natural duties, for example, or perhaps to a commitment to reciprocity in interpersonal and social relations. But it is not exactly clear how all this adds up to a natural right to liberty, unless here the right just reduces to the fact that persons have a moral status such that they are owed good reasons and owe others good reasons (where good here refers to a standard of reasonableness independent of actual consent) when they participate in relations that constrain their or others' actions. But then the natural right to liberty expresses little more than a commitment to reasonableness or reciprocity in relations with others.

Reiman's original position argument differs from Rawls's in another way. Reiman affords agents in his original position knowledge of some additional general facts. These include the fact that neither history nor theory has yielded evidence of a mode of production with greater productive capacity than capitalism (again, here understood loosely) and the fact that all known attempts to replace capitalism with a superior alternative have proved not only less efficient or productive but also less friendly to liberty overall than capitalism. Of course, while Rawls does not explicitly identify these facts as available to agents in his original position, they are probably sufficiently uncontroversial and general to be included among the facts available.

Agents in Reiman's original position also understand "the ambivalent nature of property." (Chapter 4) They know that property relations both enhance liberty by making possible gains in material resources not available without them and constrain liberty by virtue of the fact that they depend for their existence on structural coercion. Locke, Kant, Nozick, Narveson and others have all recognized this fact about property, implicitly or explicitly, but, Reiman argues, none have addressed adequately the challenge it presents. The challenge, of course, is to establish at least one form of property relations that can be relied upon reciprocally to promote the liberty of all so that all may reasonably be expected to consent to it. Reiman aims to meet this unmet challenge.

Reiman recognizes that the agents in his original position need a metric for determining whether any particular property regime reciprocally promotes the overall balance of liberty for all the social positions it constitutes and maintains. The metric must apply neutrally to all, and so be specific or peculiar to no particular, property regimes or historical periods. (Chapter 5) Reiman proposes focusing on the exchange of labor between the social positions created and maintained by each property regime considered by agents in his original position. Every property regime is a system for organizing the exchange of labor. Here labor refers simply to the time and energy expended by representative persons in particular social positions, the amount of their lives literally given over to others in the process of social production as institutionally organized by the property regime in question. Labor so understood presupposes nothing specific or peculiar to any particular property regime or historical period.

As time and energy, labor is, has always been, will always be, a limited resource for each of us. We each have only so much to give to social production and thus so much to retain for other uses. And we each have an interest in maintaining as much freedom and control over our labor as possible. Labor is unlike talents for we do not use up our talents by contributing to social production, and what counts as a talent will vary across property regimes and historical periods. Reciprocity in social production is to be measured, then, by how property relations organize the exchange of labor. This measure Reiman refers to as the "moral version of the labor theory of value." Labor is invoked by Reiman not as part of a theory of price formation and capital accumulation but rather as a system-neutral measure for assessing reciprocity in any property regime. Notwithstanding its name -- "the moral version of the labor theory of value" -- when agents in Reiman's original position rely on this system-neutral measure of reciprocity they rely on a fact, not a further moral commitment beyond the natural right to liberty and the commitment to reciprocity it entails. The natural right to liberty remains, Reiman argues, the only moral commitment introduced as a constraint on the reasoning of agents in his version of the original position argument.

Of course, exchanging labor is not the point of participating in social production. Rather, reciprocally advancing liberty overall is the point. There are here two relevant obstacles to advancing liberty overall. The first is material deprivation. We participate in social production so as to reduce material deprivation, for ourselves and others. The second obstacle is internal to social production. Social production requires property relations and property relations depend on structural coercion. Structural coercion is an obstacle to liberty, however, only when it cannot be justified to each and all subject to it. But this would seem to be the case whenever it underwrites property relations constitutive of social positions defined in terms of an unequal exchange of labor between them. Reiman refers to structural coercion that underwrites property relations of this sort as social subjugation. Social subjugation is the second obstacle to reciprocally advancing liberty overall.

Reiman argues that these two obstacles to liberty, material deprivation and structural subjugation, are fungible. So it is possible reciprocally to promote liberty overall for all social positions (or representative persons in those positions) while promoting the overall balance in different ways for different positions. To assess reciprocity in social production, then, we (or agents in Reiman's original position) must look first to the structurally coerced exchange of labor between social positions constituted and mediated by property relations. If we find inequality in the exchange of labor, then we must ask whether the social subjugation to which any social position is subject might be offset for that position by otherwise unavailable reductions in material deprivation sufficient to make it the case that, all things considered, the property relations in question in fact reciprocally advance or improve liberty overall for all social positions. Reiman's thought here is that, at least for some historical moments, coercively imposed inequalities in the exchange of labor between social positions, prima facie failures of reciprocity, might be vindicated all things considered (and given the fungibility of the obstacles to liberty) as necessary means to reciprocally improving the overall balance of liberty for all social positions.

Of course, an ideal economy would eliminate for all social positions both obstacles to liberty as fully and equally as is possible. But this ideal must be realized in and through history, taking account of the historical development of human productive capacities, and subject to a realistic account of human nature in any given period of history. In any given historical moment it may be that the surest and best path to reciprocally advancing liberty overall for all social positions is a path that involves property relations constituting social positions differentiated from one another by, among other things, the degrees to which each of the obstacles to liberty is reduced and so the overall balance of liberty advanced. For example, it may be that within a particular historical moment it is just a fact of human nature and political economy that unless available social positions are differentiated by various incentives (ultimately to be understood as inequalities in the exchange of labor, or social subjugation) persons are very unlikely to invest the time and energy necessary to develop their talents and then put those talents to use in very specific but highly productive ways within the economy. There need be no claim here that these facts obtain for all historical periods in order for them to inform agents in Reiman's original position as they endeavor for the historical period(s) where they do obtain to settle on a system of property relations that reciprocally advances liberty overall for all social positions.

Reiman argues, then, that from his original position, with agents informed by the natural right to liberty, the moral version of the labor theory of value, the ambivalent nature of property, the fungibility of the obstacles to liberty, and certain general facts about human nature under present historical conditions and about the productivity of capitalism (loosely understood) and the defects of known alternatives, it is possible to provide the "deduction" of the difference principle that eluded Rawls (Chapters 5 and 6). Reiman understands the difference principle to require, at its deepest level, reciprocity in the exchange of labor structurally coerced and maintained by a property regime. Imagine two social positions each with a single representative person, A and B. The social positions are such that each unit of labor contributed is equally productive. Suppose that that, when A and B exchange a unit of labor within the property regime, each receives goods that would require of them, were they to secure them acting outside the property regime, 1.2 units of their own labor. (Working together within the property regime they generate a cooperative surplus.) And suppose that they would rather have this gain in material goods equivalent to .2 units of labor rather than devote their labor to something other than social production, and that this gain offsets for each any loss of liberty involved in submitting to the structural coercion of the property regime in question. We can think of this as the egalitarian baseline.

Of course, as natural human persons, A and B will have different talents or potential abilities. Suppose that a reform to the property regime makes it possible for A, but not B, to double the productivity of any one unit of her labor if she develops and exercises some talent. B's productivity per unit of labor given remains the same. A is now in a position such that in giving B one unit of her labor she effectively gives B goods equivalent to two units of labor. Suppose it would be unrealistic to suppose that A will not seek some additional return from the cooperative surplus for her efforts here; after all, she will likely be spending time on education and training, committing herself to a particular line of work, and so on. Suppose A is willing to do this if in return for each unit of her more productive labor she receives from B at least goods equivalent to 1.5 units of labor. This means B will literally have to work 50% longer or harder (give more of his time and energy). So, A gives B one unit of labor and gets 1.5 units in return. B gives A 1.5 units of labor and gets, in terms of goods, what amounts to 2 units in return, a return of 1.33 units of labor for each unit of labor given. It would be reasonable for B, and so agents in an original position taking up his point of view, to consent to this if the gain to his material standard of living relative to the egalitarian baseline is sufficient to offset, in terms of the overall balance of liberty, the social subjugation involved in now being structurally coerced into an unequal exchange of labor with A. If we assume that the egalitarian baseline reflects a relatively low standard of living in material terms, then plausibly it will be reasonable to consent to this arrangement.

Of course, outside the original position B might be induced by threats or moved by desperation to accept on each unit of labor given a return smaller than goods equivalent to 1.33 units of labor. Indeed, anything greater than a return of 1.2 units would improve B's position relative to the egalitarian baseline and might be sufficient to move B to acquiesce to the arrangement. But in the absence of strategic threat advantage, and the original position excludes the possibility of such, it would be unreasonable for A to expect B to consent to any return on a unit of labor contributed less than 1.33 units. Consenting to a smaller return would amount to giving labor to A unnecessarily, without any reciprocal return. It would amount to A taking advantage of B to exact an unreasonable price for access to her talents or greater productivity.

Now suppose a further reform such that A can increase even further the productivity of each unit of labor she gives and generate for B goods equivalent to three units of labor. Suppose to do this she requires in return for each unit of labor she gives goods equivalent to at least two units of labor. Here B will have to work twice as long or hard (give double his time and energy) but will receive in return goods equivalent to three units of labor. A gives B one unit of labor and receives from B two units of labor. B gives A two units of labor and receives from A goods equivalent to three units of labor. The rate of return for B is 1.5 units of labor for each unit of labor given and for A is 2 units of labor for each unit of labor given. Again, it will be reasonable for B, and so agents in the original position, to consent to this if receiving goods equivalent to 1.5 units of labor for each unit of labor given, rather than goods equivalent to 1.33 units, constitutes a sufficiently large reduction in material deprivation as an obstacle to liberty to offset the social subjugation involved in now being coerced into an exchange of labor that is this unequal.

Again, of course, outside the original position B might be induced by threats and so forth to accept a rate of return less than 1.5 units of labor for each unit of labor given in order to gain access to A's more productive unit of labor. But within the original position this possibility does not present itself. Within the original position agents must address themselves, given general though historically indexed facts about human nature, only to incentives strictly necessary to draw especially high productivity out of any given unit of labor given over to others in social production.

The difference principle, on Reiman's view, ranks the three property regimes just surveyed in reverse order, with the third being superior to the second and the second superior to the original egalitarian baseline. Of course, it will be irrational from the point of view of liberty overall for B to continue taking on more work for greater reductions in material deprivation. At some point B will prefer retaining labor (time and energy) to devote freely to purposes (leisure or what have you) other than further reductions in material deprivation. Here it would appear Reiman contemplates arriving at something like a steady state economy insofar as further reforming property relations so as to generate even greater reductions in material deprivation no longer reciprocally contributes to improving liberty overall.

As a principle of reciprocity in the coerced exchange of labor the difference principle sets the standard to be met by all property regimes in all historical periods. But it does not specify by itself any particular form of property regime applicable across all historical periods, for productive capacities will vary across time as will general facts about what may be expected of persons given a realistic understanding of human nature. Within the present historical moment, the difference principle requires roughly what Rawls, following Meade, characterized as a property-owning democracy. But as productive capacities improve and as human nature is transformed under conditions of material plenty, with more freedom for leisure and less need for incentives to elicit the contribution of developed talents to social production, the difference principle will eventually require a property regime that looks more like socialism, and then finally communism, as described by Marx in the Critique of the Gotha Program. But for now it requires of us a property-owning democracy. For us to achieve a property-owning democracy is to achieve a society as free and as just as possible in our historical moment.

A property-owning democracy is, in one sense for Reiman, a species of communism, for it is a society the structure of which everyone can affirm as their joint creation and within which social relations are marked by genuine civic friendship and the absence of alienation. This is a communism liberals ought to embrace. Of course, Reiman contemplates a final transformation to a more complete communism, one that institutionally embodies the principle "from each according to her ability, to each according to her need." But the path to this final transformation runs through property-owning democracy and depends on its capacity to underwrite the continued development of our productive capacities and the transformation of our human nature. And in any case, when we reach that point, we will not have moved beyond the difference principle, we will simply have arrived at a point in our historical development where what it requires of us is rather different from what it requires of us now.

While Reiman devotes the lion's share of his attention to the difference principle so understood, he also articulates three Marxian liberal principles of justice (p. 182). The first is a familiar principle of equal basic liberties that includes the basic political liberties and so a commitment to democracy. The second is the difference principle as developed above and informed by the moral version of the labor theory of value. And the third is a sort of general libertarian principle prohibiting coercion unnecessary to fulfilling either of the first two principles or itself as a third principle. The first principle has lexical priority in part because without real democratic control over the structure of the economy the difference principle is likely to be unfulfilled. But Reiman seems not to think that democratic control over the structure of the economy ensures that the difference principle will be fulfilled. He argues that all three principles express constitutional essentials to be enforced, if necessary, by a Supreme Court.

Given the epistemological challenges here -- assessing the impacts of various economic policies on the deep structure of the economy as a system of coercively enforced exchanges of labor between discrete social positions -- it is not at all clear how the Court would or could do this work. Here the advantage Reiman claims for his view over Rawls's, namely the deep philosophical grounding he gives the difference principle, may prove to be something of a disadvantage. For it is not enough on Reiman's view for the Court or a democratically accountable legislature to determine that the economy is organized so as to permit between social positions only inequalities in lifetime expected shares of wealth and income necessary to maximize the share for the social position expecting the least. And this of course is difficult enough. On Reiman's view, the Court or a democratically accountable legislature must go on to determine that this structural inequality between social positions with respect to lifetime expected shares of wealth and income is necessary to or at least consistent with reciprocally advancing liberty overall for all social positions, taking into account the social subjugation involved in any structurally coerced inequalities in the exchange of labor, the fact that the obstacles to liberty overall are fungible within a certain range but that at a certain point reducing material deprivation no longer enhances liberty, and so on. It is hard to see how the difference principle read through the moral version of the labor theory of value is to function as a public criterion of distributive justice. The epistemic challenges here seem insurmountable.

It is somewhat peculiar that Reiman does not commit Marxian liberalism to a principle of equality of opportunity. He argues, briefly, instead that equality of opportunity is guaranteed by the third principle, since it prohibits all forms of coercion, including the structural coercion of racism and sexism, not necessary to fulfilling either of the first two principles or protecting the liberty of all. But there is no account here of the structural coercion of racism and sexism, which is often structural in a cultural rather than legal or institutional sense. And there is little discussion of publicly funded education, health care and so on as requirements of equality of opportunity, though these things seem to be presupposed as elements of a property owning democracy.

Two further aspects of Reiman's case for Marxian liberalism bear mention here. The first stems from the fact that while Reiman emphasizes the structurally coercive nature of a property regime, he does not in fact deploy the idea of a basic social structure when working out his argument. Indeed, in the above summary of his argument for the difference principle, I have made more explicit than he does that the relevant exchange of labor is between social positions created and maintained by a property regime rather than between particular persons. It is perhaps unsurprising, then, that Reiman never takes up the question of whether we should think of the allocation of particular goods to particular individuals by virtue of voluntary transactions within a just economy as itself an instance of pure procedural justice. Nor does he take up the question of whether there might be reasons other than those of social justice, for example, reasons arising out of special needs, to adjust such an allocation once realized. Reiman's focus on the property regime as a discrete component of the basic social structure rather than on the totality of that structure itself as a dynamic whole leads him also to leave largely unaddressed the many questions that arise when we think about how the economy interacts over time with the many other institutional components of a complete basic social structure.

The second aspect of Reiman's case for Marxian liberalism that bears mention is the more or less complete absence of any discussion of the global dimensions of capitalism today. Many will wonder how to extend Reiman's analysis so that it captures the apparently structurally coerced exchanges of labor between workers in China and the investment class in the United States (or vice versa). Others will wonder whether capitalism in developed so-called "first world" states today only appears over the course of its development to be more friendly to liberty than its alternatives because of its remarkable ability to quietly transport some of the grossest abuses of liberty upon which it depends to sites beyond the political jurisdiction of those states and easy observation by their citizens.

But these are small complaints. And Reiman compensates for these omissions by offering some illuminating and useful discussions of large ideas and themes in the work of Locke, Rousseau, Kant, Hegel, Marx and Rawls. He profitably discusses justice in the context of our historical development as a species, the relationship between alienation and freedom, the Marxian worry that there is no juridical ideal of equality that does not involve running roughshod over normatively significant differences between persons, and so on. In addition to these discussions of big themes, he also punctuates his overall argument for Marxian liberalism with brief but often helpful comments on lines of argument advanced by contemporary critics of Rawlsian liberalism such as Jan Narveson, and the late G.A. Cohen and Robert Nozick. And he does all this in a clear and accessible prose style. The book should prove fully accessible to the educated lay reader as well as the advanced undergraduate or entry-level graduate student pursuing her interest in political philosophy or theory. Those with significant expertise on matters of social or distributive justice will find it valuable too, especially the central chapters setting out the case for the difference principle as read through the moral version of the labor theory of value.