As If: Idealization and Ideals

Placeholder book cover

Kwame Anthony Appiah, As If: Idealization and Ideals, Harvard University Press, 2017, 218 pp., $27.95, ISBN 9780674975002.

Reviewed by Thomas Kelly, Princeton University


The topic of the latest stimulating book from Kwame Anthony Appiah is idealization: the kind of thing that we do when we theorize about human beings as though they were perfectly rational expected utility maximizers, or when we offer physical explanations that treat smooth surfaces as though they were frictionless -- all while knowing full well that human being are not perfectly rational expected utility maximizers, and that no actual surface is frictionless. The book grew out of a series of three Carus Lectures that Appiah delivered at the 2013 Eastern Division Meetings of the American Philosophical Association. As one would expect of a book based on public lectures intended for a general philosophical audience, it is not aimed at specialists, nor does it attempt to provide the kind of detailed account of idealization within some special science that philosophers of science sometimes offer. Rather, it consists largely of more general philosophical ruminations on the topic, along with a number of illuminating discussions of more specific applications or case studies. A central theme is the sheer range of different areas in which idealization proves a fruitful strategy, and the importance and interest of the topic for philosophy. As Appiah notes:

often in philosophy it is useful to stand back and take a broad view of a topic, knowing that real progress requires work with a narrower focus as well. I offer this book in that spirit, hoping that it will prove useful in encouraging further explorations of idealization in aesthetics, ethics, and metaphysics, as well as in the philosophy of mind, of language, of religion, and of the social and natural sciences . . .

My aim, then is not so much to announce any startling discoveries as to persuade you that idealization matters in all the major areas of the humanities and the sciences and in everyday life, and to commend it as a topic of reflection and research. (pp.ix-x)

The book's title is a tribute to its hero, the German philosopher Hans Vaihinger (1852-1933), and his magnum opus, Die Philosophie des Als Ob (The Philosophy of 'As if'). Like Appiah, Vaihinger was impressed by, and did much to document, the extensive range of contexts in which idealization is a potentially fruitful strategy, and maintained that questions about idealization are of central importance in all of the major areas of philosophy. In addition to these affinities, Appiah also credits Vaihinger with a number of more specific insights about the nature of idealization. What did Vaihinger get right? According to Appiah, "Vaihinger's fundamental thoughts . . . are two: first, that in idealization we build a picture -- a model -- of something that proceeds as if something we know is false were true; and second, that we do so because the resulting model is useful for some purpose" (pp.126-127). Building on this general framework, Appiah illustrates through examples the great diversity of purposes that can make it reasonable for us to proceed as though something that we know to be false is true in the way that is characteristic of an idealization. He suggests that, when faced with an idealization, it's often philosophically illuminating to (i) attempt to identify the false propositions that are being treated as true, (ii) inquire into why it might be useful to proceed as though these propositions were true despite their falsity, and (iii) identify the purposes for which it's useful to proceed in this way (p.170).

For Appiah and Vaihinger then, idealizations are "useful untruths" that we adopt despite knowing that they are false. Although I don't think that it amounts to a serious objection, I note in passing that there is at least one odd consequence of this way of understanding Vaihinger. On this interpretation, the example that Vaihinger himself cited as the central inspiration for his theory -- Kant's claim that as agents we must act as if we have free will, notwithstanding the knowledge that the best science of the day tells us that our actions are causally determined -- does not seem to qualify as a genuine instance of the phenomenon. For although Kant held that we do not know that we have free will, he also held that we are not in a position to know that this proposition is false -- and it's precisely this absence of knowledge that allows us to treat the proposition that we have free will as a "postulate of practical reason," and an object of rational hope. However, I suspect that the disconnect here reflects, not a problem in Appiah's interpretation of Vaihinger (and still less a problem for his preferred account of idealization) but rather excessive enthusiasm on Vaihinger's part for claiming a Kantian ancestry for his ideas in an intellectual context in which doing so would have been attractive. In any case, it would also be interesting to explore a more general notion that subsumes as special cases both idealization in Appiah's sense as well as the kind of stance that Kant recommended we adopt towards the postulates of practical reason. According to this more general notion -- call it idealization* -- when one idealizes*, one proceeds for certain purposes as though some proposition is true, despite lacking the belief that it is. Idealization in Appiah and Vaihinger's sense is a species of idealization* (since if one knows that the relevant proposition is false, one will lack the belief that it's true), but so too is the more agnostic stance that the Kantian agent adopts towards the proposition that she has free will.

The book has three chapters: "Useful Untruths" -- subtitled "Lessons from Hans Vaihinger"; "A Measure of Belief" -- subtitled "Lessons from Frank Ramsey"; and "Political Ideals" -- subtitled "Lessons from John Rawls." In at least one respect, however, the subtitles are potentially misleading. While Appiah really does draw lessons from Vaihinger and also from Ramsey (about whom, more below), a reader of the book naturally gets the impression that Appiah thinks that Rawls gets much more wrong than right, at least when it comes to issues in this vicinity. Here, Appiah adds his voice to recent critics of "ideal theory" within political philosophy. In general, the kind of ideal theorizing that he takes to be objectionable is one "that seeks to guide our actions in the actual imperfect world by the image of utopia" (p.115). (In addition to Rawls, Dworkin and Nozick are also cited as examples of prominent theorists whose work embodies this shortcoming.) In the context of Rawls' project, the allegedly objectionable idealization involves his explicit methodological stipulation of strict or full compliance. According to this stipulation, we should choose among possible rules for a society on the assumption that whichever rules are chosen will be consistently followed by the members of the society in which they are adopted. But why, Appiah asks, should we suppose that the right way to frame the rules of a just society is to consider the consequences of adopting rules with which actual people will almost certainly not fully comply? A better procedure, he sensible suggests, would take into account what our best social science has to say about which norms it's realistic to expect people to follow (pp.123-124).

In addition, Appiah has another important objection to the kind of normative political theorizing that attempts to put us in a position to draw conclusions about our actual situation by way of delineating what an ideally just society would look like: it rests on a faulty moral epistemology. Following Amartya Sen, Appiah points out that one is often in a position to recognize that some social option is better than an alternative, where this is not a matter of starting with a vision of the ideal society and then figuring out which of the two options would, if realized, bring us closer to that ideal. Moreover, what holds at the individual level holds at the collective level as well:

The history of our collective moral learning doesn't start with the growing acceptance of a picture of an ideal society. It starts with the rejection of some current practice or structure, which we come to see as wrong. You learn to be in favor of equality by noticing what is wrong with the unequal treatment of blacks, or women, or working-class or lower-caste people. (pp.168-169)

(Readers of Appiah's excellent account of actual "moral revolutions," The Honor Code (2010), will find obvious connections here.)

Even a reader who comes to the book with some sense of how broadly the topic of idealization extends might be surprised by the sheer range of issues that are treated at least briefly in its pages. These include the following, among others: the relationship between idealization and pretense; why it might be useful to construct theories that idealize with respect to normative facts; the relevance of idealization to theories about the ethics of migration and asylum-seeking; whether an appeal to idealization can help us make sense of practices that involve assigning people to categories that one officially disavows (as when someone who thinks that, strictly speaking, there are no such things as races nevertheless defends race-based affirmative action programs); and whether an appeal to idealization might preserve an important role for talk of "character" and "virtues" even if we accept the situationist critique of the psychological reality of these notions that has been urged by some social psychologists. Notwithstanding the diverse range of topics that are touched on at least briefly, and the official theme of idealization as important for every area of philosophy and beyond, much of the book is devoted to what is in fact a particular case, albeit one that is central to several disciplines: the idealization that is involved in modeling human beings as fully rational. This is the concern of both the second part of Chapter 1 (in the context of an interesting discussion of Daniel's Dennett "intentional stance") as well as the entirety of Chapter 2. (By contrast, almost nothing of substance is said in the book about the areas in which the technique of idealization has enjoyed its clearest and most spectacular successes, the natural sciences.) Because Chapter 2 contains the most sustained argumentation of the book, and I was not fully persuaded by what is said there, let me close this review by saying something about that discussion.

Consider the idealization involved in modelling human beings as perfectly rational in the decision theoretic sense (which requires, among other things, that their degrees of belief satisfy the axioms of the probability calculus, and thus that they possess a kind of logical omniscience). For what purpose or purposes is this standard idealization appropriate? Traditionally, there have been two main answers to this question. First, it might be that although actual human beings are obviously not perfectly rational in this sense, proceeding on the assumption that they are is nevertheless empirically useful for describing or predicting their behavior. Secondly, it might be that the standard idealization earns its keep as a normative model, a model of what actual agents should do, or what they have most reason to do. Interestingly, Appiah rejects both of these traditional answers. On the one hand, we should not expect that the standard idealization will be empirically useful for describing or predicting behavior in a detailed way (p.101), because we know that many of its predictions will turn out to be false. But on the other hand, Appiah rejects the suggestion that the standard idealization is an appropriate normative model, for the following reason: given how far actual human beings will inevitably fall short of the relevant standards (e.g., logical omniscience) because of our computational limitations, it's plausible that we would do better not by trying to live up to those standards, but rather by adopting relatively simple, computationally tractable heuristics and rules of thumb instead (pp. 93-94).

Despite his generally skeptical stance towards the usual stories as to why the standard idealization is a useful one, Appiah is not skeptical that it is useful; and he develops an alternative, third story about the purposes that the standard idealization serves. As I understand that story, it comes to this: the standard idealization makes the notions of degrees of belief and desire theoretically and empirically respectable. It does this by characterizing those notions in terms of the functional roles that they would play in the mental lives of hypothetical, computationally perfect agents who are otherwise similar to us -- our 'Cognitive Angels.' The standard idealization thus vindicates the notions of degrees of belief and of desire by bringing them within the purview of analytic functionalism, which allows us to define these notions holistically, in terms of the relations that they stand in to other mental states and observable behavior. According to the vision of the traditional, "common sense" analytic functionalist, the folk psychological notions of all-or-nothing belief and desire can be characterized, at least in principle, by constructing the Ramsey sentence of the assembled platitudes of folk psychology. According to Appiah's vision, the more technical notions of degrees of belief and desire can be characterized, at least in principle, by constructing the Ramsey sentence of classical decision theory plus the relevant parts of probability theory.

As ingenious as this proposal is, it will not move those who are less enamored of analytic functionalism than Appiah, or more generally, of the strategy of attempting to gain philosophical insight and illumination by constructing the Ramsey sentences of our theories.[1] By my lights, the best bet for friends of the standard idealization is rather to defend the idea that it provides an illuminating normative model against Appiah's critique of that idea. While I believe that Appiah is right to think that things might very well go worse for us if we tried to live up to the standard idealization, I don't think that this amounts to a compelling reason to conclude that it is not the correct normative account. Consider a parallel case. Since at least the time of Sidgwick, sophisticated utilitarians have acknowledged the empirical possibility that, if people explicitly adopted utilitarianism and tried to follow it, things might very well go worse, as judged by the utilitarian, than if people adopted and tried to follow simple heuristics and rules of thumb instead. In that case, the utilitarian will recommend adopting and trying to follow the simple heuristics and rules of thumb, as opposed to utilitarianism. As some have argued,[2] however, all of that is perfectly consistent with the possibility that utilitarianism is the correct normative ethical theory, in the sense of providing the correct account of which actions we morally ought to perform, or which actions we have most moral reason to perform. Similarly: even if, as Appiah suggests, we would do worse by trying to live up to the standards of decision theoretic rationality, it doesn't follow that decision theory is not the correct normative theory, in the sense of providing the correct account of which actions we ought rationally to perform, or which actions we have most normative reason to perform.

Although I believe that the point holds in the case of action, it seems even clearer when we turn to the case of belief, which is Appiah's ultimate concern in this context. For when it comes to belief formation, trying to form certain beliefs, or to follow certain norms, seems to be a relatively marginal phenomenon. It's plausible that, in at least some cases, we really do manage to have those degrees of belief that our ideally rational selves would have. This happens, for example, when one becomes completely certain of a claim that one recognizes to be a tautology, or completely certain that a recognized contradiction is false, or when one divides one's credence evenly between 'heads' and 'tails' when a random coin is about to be flipped. In such cases, however, the fact that one's degrees of belief match the degrees of belief of one's perfectly rational self isn't a result of one's trying to have those degrees of belief (or to follow certain norms) and succeeding; rather, one's response to one's evidential situation is much more direct, immediate, and automatic. Perhaps if I explicitly tried to follow the norm of proportioning my beliefs to the evidence, I would do worse at proportioning my beliefs to the evidence than if I simply responded to the evidence in the usual way, as it hits me. (Again, it's an empirical question whether that's so.) But even if I would do worse by trying to follow the norm, it would be a mistake to conclude on that basis that proportioning one's beliefs to the evidence is not a genuine norm, after all.[3]

As I hope this review makes clear, As If contains a wealth of interesting ideas. It fully succeeds in its stated aim of demonstrating the interest and importance of idealization as an object of philosophy inquiry, and it manages to do so in a way that is both sophisticated and accessible to a relatively wide audience. Appiah is the rare public intellectual who is also a first-rate analytic philosopher, and the characteristic virtues associated with each of these identities are very much in evidence throughout the book.

[1] For a recent, powerful critique of the strategy, see Mark Johnston and Sarah-Jane Leslie, "Concepts, Analysis, Generics, and the Canberra Plan," Philosophical Perspectives 26 (2012):113-171, especially pages 145-164.

[2] See especially Derek Parfit, Reasons and Persons (Oxford University Press 1984),Part One.

[3] For a strong defense of the idea that even some rational ideals that are computationally unattainable for human beings are genuinely normative, see David Christensen, Putting Logic In its Place (Oxford University Press 2004), especially Chapter 6, "Logic and Idealization."