Ascent: Philosophy and Paradise Lost

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Tzachi Zamir, Ascent: Philosophy and Paradise Lost, Oxford University Press, 2018, 203pp., $49.95, ISBN 9780190695088.

Reviewed by Richard Gaskin, University of Liverpool


This is a suggestive but also a very unsatisfying book. Tzachi Zamir discusses a number of respects in which Paradise Lost raises difficulties for Milton's philosophical reader, and he considers how Milton either did respond to these in the poem and elsewhere in his writings, or would have responded if asked. But the discussion remains at a rather superficial level. I shall consider four areas where this especially emerges.

At the end of Book II, Satan undertakes his daring mission and flies to Hell Gates. There he encounters the portress Sin, whom he himself had created, and Death, whom he had fathered on Sin. Zamir quotes the initial description of Death (666-73):

             The other shape --
If shape it might be called that shape had none
Distinguishable in member, joint, or limb,
Or substance might be called that shadow seemed,
For each seemed either -- black it stood as Night,
Fierce as ten Furies, terrible as Hell,
And shook a dreadful dart; what seemed his head
The likeness of a kingly crown had on.

Death, Zamir tells us, is indescribable; he 'proves resilient to linguistic impositions'; in this respect he resembles Chaos, 'that amorphous element into which everything is in danger of disintegrating' (p. 72). 'Death is at once destructive agency and an ineffable state; words must slide off its formless surface'. 'To fear death is to recoil from disintegration'. Philosophers assert that death 'is not a state or an event for a subject' (p. 73). We are given no evidence for this latter claim, but one might think of Wittgenstein: 'Death is not an event in life. One does not experience death' (Tractatus §6.4311). Zamir concludes his discussion of this part of the poem with the thought that death's formlessness is 'the polar opposite of gardening -- the form-bestowing activity with which Adam and Eve are tasked' (p. 74).

That is a nice thought. But what one misses here is a deeper investigation of the very ideas of formlessness and ineffability, and of the way in which our understanding of these notions -- if indeed we can understand them -- affects our reading of Milton's poem. It is hardly satisfactory for the critic simply to take over Milton's own claims concerning shapelessness and indescribability. Critics, of course, love the idea of (in general) ineffability; it is one of their favourite clichés. But the application of the idea is always attended with (in my view) insuperable problems. Milton is no exception. Death is supposed to be indescribable, but he is described. He has no distinguishable parts, but he seems to wear a crown on his head, and he shakes (what with?) his dart at Satan. He approaches Satan 'with horrid strides' (of what?). He then talks to Satan (how?), they level their weapons at each other with, so we are told, 'fatal hands', and an elaborate simile conveys their mutually hostile posture. Death, Sin later tells us, came into the world from her womb 'brandishing his fatal dart', and when Sin fled, Death pursued, overtook her, raped her, and would by now have devoured her 'but that he knows/ His end with mine involved' (806-7). When Satan informs Sin and Death of his mission (845-8),

both seemed highly pleased, and Death
Grinned horrible a ghastly smile, to hear
His famine should be filled, and blessed his maw
Destined to that good hour,

which confirms again for us that, as we had rather begun to suspect, Death does have some distinguishable body parts after all: he would appear to have a head, mouth, eyes, ears, torso, stomach, diaphragm, vocal chords, arms, legs, sexual organs, and no doubt much more besides; indeed, he probably looks pretty similar to a monstrous human being. Chaos too, though apparently indescribable, is described in detail.

Lest this seem like Bentleian nit-picking, let me come to the point. When authors tell us that something is indescribable, they as often as not go on to describe it.[1] Naturally they do so: they are wordsmiths. More fundamentally, the point is that they, and we, are located in language, and to say that something is indescribable is already straightforwardly self-refuting. What is the implication of this for Milton's poem? Schopenhauer calls 'die Leiden der Menschheit' namenlos, but he seems to concede that Dante does name and describe them, in his Hell, being able to do so since his materials are drawn from the sufferings of this world.[2] Milton, too, draws on the observable phenomena of this world in order to describe Heaven, Hell, and Chaos; he draws on human psychology in his characterizations of God, Christ, Satan, and every other conscious agent in his poem, regardless of that agent's metaphysical nature. Paradise Lost is, ultimately, like Dante's Inferno, a poem about this world and about us. Rather than simply taking Milton's pronouncements of ineffability at face value, it would have been better if Zamir, in a book which is purportedly a contribution to philosophy and not just to literary criticism, had subjected them to a little testing. For Milton's materials, as Waldock saw (Paradise Lost and its Critics, pp. 45-57), in fact proved recalcitrant.

The same applies to Milton's treatment of Christ's sacrifice. Zamir suggests that 'The Son altogether overturns the vocabulary of debt and gratitude by undertaking another's debt (p. 163). His idea is that, while Satan thinks in commercial terms, in terms of ownership and debt and compensation, of 'power relations' (p. 164), and of gifts as 'merely part of an economic calculus of reward-based transactions' (p. 165), Christ rises above these grubby and all-too-human modes of thought: 'The Son undertakes debts that are not his own, and they are settled by his act' (p. 156). But since when did economic relations depend on the settlement of debts by the debtor himself, as opposed to a friend or proxy? All the creditor cares about is that his debt gets paid: who pays it is a matter of indifference. How does this bear on Milton? In this way: Milton is not superseding or transcending the language of debt in his portrayal of Christ's sacrifice. On the contrary, he is following strict orthodoxy in representing that sacrifice exactly in terms of a debt and its settlement. God does not simply cancel man's debt (as he might); he demands that it be paid (III, 203-2):

But yet all is not done. Man disobeying,
Disloyal breaks his fealty, and sins
Against the high supremacy of Heav'n,
Affecting Godhead, and so losing all,
To expiate his treason hath naught left,
But to destruction sacred and devote,
He with his whole posterity must die;
Die he or justice must; unless for him
Some other able, and as willing, pay
The rigid satisfaction, death for death.

Since man cannot pay himself, he requires a proxy; and Christ now steps forward to discharge the debt. The fact that God does not then say to Christ 'No: self-sacrifice on your part is irrelevant to man's debt; he must pay it himself', the fact that God accepts Christ's proxy action as discharging the debt in full, shows that, in Milton's poem as in orthodox Christianity, the debt has to be settled, one way or another; it cannot simply be annulled. We have precisely not left the mercantile world for a higher and purer plane of existence: we are still stuck right in the middle of the economic mindset, the language of transactions and obligations and debits and credits. In John Milton as in Milton Friedman, there is no such thing as a free lunch; somebody has to pay. In fact the poet's political economy is harsher and more draconian that the ordinary market's calculus, because in the real commercial world debts are sometimes simply cancelled. This feature of the poem cries out for theorizing, because one feels that Zamir is right to this extent: Milton would like Christ's sacrifice to transcend merely human economic relations; but his material has again proved recalcitrant.

I turn to the doctrine of original sin. Here Zamir recognizes the problem, but instead of solving it he again, as in the case of ineffability, simply reproduces it. Lucy Newlyn showed in her Paradise Lost and the Romantic Reader (1993) that Eve has already fallen before she officially falls, and Zamir -- though he does not refer to Newlyn (in fact his use of secondary literature is altogether rather thin) -- is aware of this point: he devotes some pages to the problem that sin and evil appear to have entered Eden before their official emergence. His strategy for dealing with the difficulty is to distinguish between evil and the merely not-good: Adam and Eve have no knowledge of the former, but they do of the latter (p. 170). Now, what is this intermediate status -- that of being not good but also not evil? Note that it is not a condition of indifference or neutrality: the not-good is definitely bad. So why is it not evil? Is Milton distinguishing between bad and evil? Surely not: but we are given no guidance in answering these questions. Instead, Zamir further muddies the waters by telling us that, while prelapsarian sin involves 'looking at the world without seeing God in it' (p. 175), postlapsarian evil is, by contrast, 'the deactivation of a distinct way of responding to God' (p. 176). What is the difference supposed to be? And if disobeying God's direct instructions, as both Adam and Eve do before they officially acquire knowledge of evil, does not involve evil, by Milton's reckoning, it is hard to see what would. This is the problem, and Zamir does not solve it, or help towards a solution. Maybe it cannot be solved, but then that should be recognized, not talked around.

Milton was no friend to philosophers, and at one point Zamir imagines a dialogue between him and Descartes, in which the poet tells the philosopher that his vision is clouded, that he cannot see God in the world (pp. 118-19). Descartes would, obviously, not be impressed by this message: he was as devout in his way as Milton was in his, and he would reply that he is trying to place belief in God on a firm foundation, not simply taking it for granted as Milton does. 'The richness or paucity of the perceived world is a function of our spiritual capacity', says Zamir on Milton's behalf, and he adds that philosophers who pursue traditional epistemology, as Descartes did, 'are begging the question against . . . a position for which the contents of knowledge . . . are themselves determined by what one thinks one experiences' (p. 118). What one thinks one experiences? Suppose one is deluded? Descartes wants to demonstrate God's existence (and the existence of much else) in a way that is proof even against the most that the sceptic can bring to bear. Milton is, of course, not in that business: he counters the sceptic with faith, not argument. Very well; but who then is begging questions against whom?

Empson once remarked that the central problem of Paradise Lost is 'how Milton can have thought it to justify God' (Milton's God, p. 140). Zamir, though he does not quote this, seems to have written his book with the intention of answering Empson's objection on Milton's behalf. Does the poet demonstrate the philosopher's worries to be unfounded, and if so how? It is not enough here to summon metaphors or intone names of ordinary concepts as though the mere act of incantation invested them with significance. This is what find so frequently in the Heideggerian tradition, and Zamir tries the trick with 'hosting', a concept he appeals to throughout the work, but not in a way that, for this reader at least, casts any illumination. For example, we are told that 'If philosophy should generate well-defined conclusions, poetry facilitates a temporary hosting of wisdom' (p. 184). Does that just mean that poetry can convey a kind of wisdom not amenable to precise analysis? That is indeed a claim that is frequently lodged by critics and theorists, though I have not myself seen a justification of it. In the critical and theoretical literature, the claim seems never to progress beyond the status of an unquestioned mantra. But if that is all that Zamir means, what work is the metaphor of hosting doing? It looks like mere decoration, or perhaps something a little more disreputable -- an attempt to give the impression of profundity but without substance. The true philosopher expects ratiocination, not metaphor or magic. For any philosopher -- or indeed for any reasonably alert reader of Paradise Lost -- Zamir's attempted defence of Milton is, it has to be said, disappointing. If Milton's ways are to be justified to his readers, the enquiry has to be more incisive than this. Perhaps the thing cannot be done, and we just have to love the poem as it is, faults and failures and incoherences and all. That is certainly an attitude that many readers do take to the epic. But one way or the other we need clarity, and in an academic work we have the right to demand it.

[1] I give further examples of this in my forthcoming Tragedy and Redress in Western Literature: a Philosophical Perspective (Routledge, 2018), §37.

[2] Schopenhauer, Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung, 2 vols., ed. W. Freiherr von Löhneysen (Suhrkamp, 1986), §59, vol. 1, 445–7.