Asking Questions: Using Meaningful Structures to Imply Ignorance

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Robert Fiengo, Asking Questions: Using Meaningful Structures to Imply Ignorance, Oxford University Press, 2007, 179pp., $54.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199208418.

Reviewed by Kent Bach, San Francisco State University


The distinguished linguist Robert Fiengo has produced a fascinating book. Asking Questions could almost be subtitled "Everything You Ever Wanted to Know about Questions but Never Thought to Ask." It insightfully addresses many major questions about questions and many more smaller but equally interesting ones. Fiengo sketches a big picture of the interrogative landscape, but to me the delight is as much in the details. You'll find out how different forms of interrogative sentences are characteristically used, how negation figures into the different forms and their uses, how multiple questions are structured. You'll be treated to subtle observations about tag questions, rhetorical questions, repeat questions, and even "wh-the-hell" questions. You'll learn how interrogative sentences can be used to express disbelief, nonbelief, astonishment, or surprise, and how they can be used to accuse. The discussion is generally clear although sometimes complex, as Fiengo explores various interactions between syntactic, semantic, and pragmatic aspects of questions. Acknowledging the messiness of the subject, at the end he warns against trying to tidy it up too much. But he has done much to clean up the mess.

One source of untidiness is the fact, noted by Fiengo early on, that we use the term 'question' both for sentences of a certain type and for acts of using them. He neglects to mention that we use it also for the things we ask, as indeed he does in his title. After all, we ask questions, not sentences or acts, and we can use different sentences to ask the same question. We also consider, ponder, and answer questions, and these are neither sentences nor acts. To avert confusion, it might be best to follow David Braun's (2006) practice of reserving the noun 'question' for the things people ask and use the phrase 'interrogative sentence' for the linguistic forms typically used to perform interrogative speech acts. The obvious verb for reporting such an act is 'ask', followed by either a directly quoted interrogative sentence or an unquoted interrogative clause.

Fiengo proposes a novel syntax of interrogative sentences, notes many curious facts about the semantics of questions, and, in the course of distinguishing different sorts of ignorance that we have occasion to overcome, makes numerous pragmatic observations about the different things speakers may "angle for" when asking questions. There is of course the familiar distinction between yes/no and wh-questions, but it is complemented by Fiengo's novel and equally important distinction between open questions and confirmation questions. Open questions have drawn almost all the attention in this area, but confirmation questions are interesting in their own right, both syntactically and pragmatically. Whereas asking an open question invites the hearer to provide one with a bit of information, given by answering "Yes" or "No" or by filling in the wh-blank, asking a confirmation question angles for something else: a justification, a clarification, or even just a repetition. For example, if you are told that in many parts of the world people eat insects, you might utter "People eat insects?" to elicit further information (a mere "Yes!" wouldn't suffice), enough to entitle you to assert it yourself. If you don't believe your ears when told of a certain football result, you might ask "Appalachian State beat Michigan?" to make sure that you heard it right. Or you could ask "Appalachian State beat who?" to get confirmation that it was not Millington but powerhouse Michigan that lowly Appalachian State miraculously defeated. Fiengo observes that whereas standard, open questions take an inverted or "deformed" form (in English and many other languages anyway), confirmation questions do not. Here, however, it might be objected that any confirmation question can be turned into an open question that makes explicit the sort of confirmation you seek. For example, instead of skeptically asking "Appalachian State beat Michigan?" you could ask "How do you know Appalachian State beat Michigan?", and instead of asking "Appalachian State beat who?" you could ask "Who did you say Appalachian State beat?" Indeed, if you sought confirmation from someone else, you could use the unembellished deformed negative interrogative sentence, "Didn't Appalachian State beat Michigan?"

At any rate, Fiengo maintains that the distinction between open and confirmation questions corresponds to another distinction he draws, between incomplete sentence-types and incompletely used sentence-types. He claims that the inverted sentence forms standardly used to ask open questions are inherently incomplete, whereas the undeformed ones used to ask confirmation questions are not. However, it is not entirely clear just what he means by the incompleteness of inverted sentences. His motivation is clear. He rejects the popular view that interrogative sentences have some extra feature that marks them as questioning devices. His idea, rather, is that they lack something and that this lack reflects the questioner's indicated lack of information. Fiengo thinks that deformed yes/no interrogative sentences lack "propositional glue" -- "the sentence-type is incomplete in that it is not part of what is expressed that the predicate … applies to [the subject]" (pp. 48-49). It is the deformation of the sentence that deprives it of its propositional glue. Fiengo is inspired here by Frege's idea that concepts, the contents of predicates, are "unsaturated." This idea seems applicable to deformed wh-sentences, where the site of wh-movement can be thought of as occupied by a variable. It marks the spot (or a spot, in the case of multiple wh-questions) where information is needed. But it is not so clear with deformed yes/no interrogative sentences. It seems that the semantic content of 'Are sharks fish?' is the same as the semantic content of the 'whether'-clause in 'Billy asked whether sharks are fish'. In both cases this is the question whether sharks are fish (of course, reporting a question as asked is not to ask it oneself). So how could only the first be incomplete?

Philosophers will be puzzled by Fiengo's occasional characterization of wh-interrogative sentences as expressing propositions, albeit incomplete ones (see, e.g., pp. 45 and 47). This usage is rather odd, since the semantic contents of interrogative sentences are not capable of being true of false. Whereas propositions have truth values, questions have answers. As suggested earlier, using the word 'question' for the things people ask (or ponder) helps us keep in mind the distinction between the thing asked and the linguistic means for asking it. More substantively, recognizing questions as distinct in kind from propositions makes it easier to see that answers to questions are not mere propositions. That is because, as Jonathan Schaffer (2007) has forcefully argued, answers are not mere propositions. Knowing the (or an) answer to a question is more than knowing a proposition that answers it, for one can know the proposition without knowing it as the answer to the question in question. He and I (Bach 2005) have suggested different ways to understand the relation between answers and questions and what someone knows when they know an answer to a question.

There is another virtue in construing the semantic contents of interrogative sentences as questions rather than incomplete propositions, as abstracta with answers rather than truth values. It leads directly to the distinction between the act of asking a question and the reason for asking it. A main theme of Fiengo's book is that we ask questions to relieve ourselves of ignorance of one sort or another and that the various forms of interrogative sentence we use to ask questions "display the lacks that we wish to relieve ourselves of" (p. 1). However, displaying ignorance is not necessary for felicitously asking a question. Indeed, it may even be obvious to all that the addressee knows the answer, as when one asks the question in order to put the addressee on the record, to make it publicly and explicitly known that the person accepts a certain answer to the question. This is the sort of reason for which a lawyer might ask a certain question of a courtroom witness or a reporter might ask one of a politician. In a different sort of case, as Fiengo points out, one can ask a question to see if the addressee knows the answer: "Quiz questions teach us that one may use a sentence-type that displays a lack without having that lack" (p. 78). He observes that undeformed sentence-types can be used to ask quiz questions ("Bismarck is the capital of what state?"), but it seems that deformed sentence-types can too ("What state is Bismarck the capital of?"), even though they are normally used to ask open questions in order to reduce one's ignorance. However, by focusing on the reason for asking a question (normally to get relief from a bit of ignorance), Fiengo overlooks what is essential to the act of asking a question. That, of course, is to get an answer. Thinking of questions as the interrogative counterparts of propositions, as things that have answers rather than truth values, makes this easy to see.

I mentioned at the outset that Fiengo identifies an interesting variety of specialized sorts of questions or, I should say, interrogative speech acts typically performed by using specific forms of interrogative sentence. For example, he identifies a category of closed questions, typically asked with a negative yes/no sentence (the negation has to be of the sentence, not the predicate). For example, you could say "Wasn't the butler off that day?" to express your understanding that the butler was not at the mansion where a murder was committed. You say it to rebut a suggestion that the butler did it but in so doing invite support for that suggestion. Fiengo gives a different sort of example. On a very hot day you ask someone who is wearing a three-piece, "Aren't you hot?" You wonder how he could possibly not be hot, but you're seeking information that might counter your assumption.

Also within the category of yes/no questions is the specialized form that linguists call "tag-questions." Not to be confused with them, Fiengo observes, are what he calls "tag-challenges." So, for example, one would use "That is a persimmon, isn't it?" to ask a tag-question, which Fiengo takes to be a closed question (or is it a confirmation question?) but would use "That is a persimmon, is it?" to issue a tag-challenge. Notice the opposite polarity of the two tags.

Fiengo devotes an entire chapter to the question of what the difference is between 'what' and 'which'. His intriguing semantic answer relies on an analogy with the quantifiers 'each' and 'every'. He suggests that 'which', like 'each', is "totalizing," whereas 'what', like 'every', is not. Since his account of the difference is too complicated to explain here, I will offer a simpler suggestion, which, I think, reflects a syntactic difference between the two. Whereas 'which' can and frequently does occur in partitive phrases of the form 'which of the Ks', phrases of the form 'what of the Ks' are ill formed. So we might say that 'which' is "selective," in the sense that answering a which-question involves selecting members out of a group (this is especially clear when the members are enumerated). 'Which', in contrast to 'what', is often used in disjunctive questions, such as 'Which do you prefer, coffee or tea?' A further thing to consider here is the difference between interrogative 'what' and 'which' might have something to do with the fact that 'which' but not 'what' can be used as a relative pronoun (so can 'who', 'where', and 'when').

In discussing what- and which-questions, as well who-questions, specifically those asked with copular sentences ('What is a … ?', 'Which one is the … ?', 'Who is that?', etc.), Fiengo invokes two distinctions due to Austin (1953) and applies them to questions, distinguishing four kinds. With respect to "direction of fit," he contrasts (1) asking about an item with (2) asking about what fits a predicate (has a property). Combining direction of fit with "onus of match," he distinguishes (1a) asking what something is called ("Calling") from asking what it is like ("Describing") and (2a) asking for an illustration of a kind ("Exemplifying") from asking which of a given set of items are of a certain kind ("Classing").

In this connection and others Fiengo often speaks of asking for an "item" (as opposed to a name, a kind, or a predicate) and of (an addressee) "producing" an item. This is misleading, even if not taken literally. For one thing, it assumes that any good answer refers to the item and does not merely describe it. On the widely (though not universally) held Russellian view that definite descriptions are quantifier phrases, not referring terms, descriptional answers to questions do not specify an item, much less produce it. Indeed, unlike genuine referring terms definite descriptions do not provide values of variables. This poses a problem for the view that wh-expressions in interrogative sentences are associated with variables. For anyone who accepts a Russellian view of descriptions, the only direct way to avoid this problem is to deny that describing an item, even uniquely, genuinely answers a who- or what-question. Obviously this is an implausibly extreme move.

Another reason why 'asking for an item' is misleading is that the questioner can already be familiar with the item -- it can even be present -- without knowing that it constitutes the answer to the question. Your twin brother could be the culprit without you knowing that he is. A related point here is that any given question has many different correct answers (it is arguable that an incorrect "answer" is not really an answer at all, but merely the content of an unsuccessful attempt to give one). A (correct) answer can be more or less informative and more or less relevant to the interests of the person asking the question. Accordingly, as Braun (2006) carefully explains, what is accepted as a satisfactory answer, e.g. to a who-question, generally has to do more than merely specify the individual in question. It has to do it in a certain way. Otherwise, as the adage says, one question leads to another.

Fiengo indicates that he will not take up when-, where-, why-, and how-questions, but he does not explain why he will omit these "adjunct-questions" in favor of questions involving "wh-expressions that cover either argument or predicate positions" (p. 101). Taking them up might have revealed some interesting and distinctive facts and, if not, allowed for greater generalization. Also, when- and where-questions aren't always adjunct-questions. If you utter "When is the wedding, and where will it be?", in which these wh-expressions are extracted from predicate position, you are asking the equivalent of a what-question: what is the time and what is the place of the wedding?" This invites the question whether 'when' and 'where' are semantically equivalent to 'at what time' and 'at what place'. Similarly, are 'why' and 'how' semantically equivalent to 'for what reason/cause' and 'by what means/manner'? Answers to these questions might help decide whether Fiengo's claims about the wh-expressions he does consider generalize to those he puts to the side.

The loose ends cited above are meant not as complaints but as examples of further topics to be explored in the fertile area of inquiry that Fiengo has explored so adventurously. As he gladly acknowledges at the end of his fine book, his "goal has been to give a first sketch of the terrain, one that reckons with both matters of use and matters of grammar" (p. 171). Although I have neglected the most original and most intricate, hence most difficult to summarize, part of the book, the syntax and pragmatics of multiple questions, I heartily endorse Fiengo's conclusion that "syntax, no matter how baroque, cannot render pragmatics superfluous, and pragmatics, no matter how clever, cannot render syntax superfluous." The subject of questions -- and answers -- is an excellent case in point, as Asking Questions so richly illustrates.


Austin, J. L. (1953), "How to Talk: Some Simple Ways," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 53: 227-246. Reprinted in J. L. Austin, Philosophical Papers, J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press (1961), pp. 181-200.

Bach, Kent (2005), "Questions and Answers" (commentary on Schaffer 2007),

Braun, David (2006), "Now You Know Who Hong Oak Yun Is," Philosophical Issues 16: 24-42.

Schaffer, Jonathan (2007), "Knowing the Answer," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75 (2), 383-403.