Aspects of Agency: Decisions, Abilities, Explanations, and Free Will

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Alfred R. Mele, Aspects of Agency: Decisions, Abilities, Explanations, and Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2017, 251 pp., ISBN 9780190659974.

Reviewed by Derk Pereboom, Cornell University


Al Mele's impressive new book features his most recent contributions to the philosophy of agency and free will. Several of the early chapters set out the key notions in philosophy of action relevant to the free will debate, and they do so with unsurpassed lucidity. Participants in the free will debate will find this material valuable for clarifying their own thinking and writing.

Chapter 2 features a careful and resourceful defense of Mele's Davidsonian causalism concerning explanation of intentional action against recent noncausalist opponents. Mele formulates his causalist position as follows:

Necessarily, if E is an adequate explanation of an intentional action A performed by an individual agent S, E cites a belief, desire, or intention that was a cause of A. (30)

The discussion here is intricate, but Mele's core contention is the Davidsonian thesis that the opponents of causalism lack an adequate account of the reason for which an agent acts. The test case is one in which an agent has more than one reason to act, but acts for only one of them. For instance, Al has two reasons for mowing his lawn in the morning, to mow at a convenient time and to exact revenge on his sleeping neighbor (32-33). Causalism can claim that Al's in fact acting for just one of these reasons is a matter of the action being caused by one and not the other. Mele argues that all of the various alternative views fall short. No better or more comprehensive defense of causalism is available.

The second half of the book consists in an extended consideration of the case that various philosophers have made against event-causal libertarianism. Event-causal libertarianism is incompatibilist about causal determinism and the key notions of free will and moral responsibility at play in the philosophical debate. It specifies the falsity of causal determination in the case of free decisions and actions, and it claims that the causes of free decisions are exclusively events. Agent-causal libertarianism, by contrast, affirms that agents, fundamentally as substances, and not just insofar as they are involved in events, can cause decisions and actions, and that they can do so without being causally determined to act by factors beyond their control. Mele is officially agnostic about libertarianism in general and about event-causal libertarianism in particular. But his main aim in this part of the book is to defend event-causal libertarianism as a viable option.

Randolph Clarke (e.g., 2003) has argued that event-causal libertarianism allows for no more responsibility-relevant control in action than compatibilism does, but that the sort of free will required for moral responsibility demands control that is enhanced relative to what compatibilism can offer. This objection to event-causal libertarianism is the focus of Chapter 7. The idea is that if it's agreed that agents whose actions are causally determined lack the control in acting required for moral responsibility, mere addition of indeterminacy won't supply the requisite enhanced control. If factors beyond the agent's control, rather than determining a single decision, instead simply leave open which decision will occur, and the agent would seem to have no greater role in the production of the decision than she does in the deterministic context, then there is no more reason to think that she can be morally responsible than there is in the deterministic context. Mele points out that there are two ways in which this might be so: the required control might be of a different sort, or of the same sort but greater in degree. As he argues, it's difficult to measure degrees of control, and to sort out control into kinds.

For me, the relevant considerations are these. First, a manipulation argument (e.g., Mele 2006; Pereboom 2014) shows that causal determination is incompatible with the relevant control. Second, the disappearing agent argument (examined below) indicates that event-causal indeterminism cannot accommodate the relevant control. Thus, if we are free in the sense at issue, we must have control in acting, either in kind or degree, that is enhanced relative to the control we would have if we were causally determined or if our actions were event-causally undetermined. The issue would thus depend partly on the strength of the disappearing agent argument, which Mele considers in detail in Chapter 8.

Here is my disappearing agent objection to event-causal libertarianism (the statement I currently prefer):

Suppose that a decision is made in a deliberative context in which the agent's moral motivations favor deciding to A, her prudential motivations favor her deciding to not-A, and the strengths of these motivations are in equipoise. A and not-A are the options she is considering. The potentially causally relevant events, typically belief- or desire-involving events, thus render the occurrence of each of these decisions equiprobable. But then the potentially causally relevant events do not settle which decision occurs, that is, whether the decision to A or the decision to not-A occurs. Since, given event-causal libertarianism, only events are causally relevant, nothing settles which decision occurs. Thus it can't be the agent or anything about the agent that settles which decision occurs, and she therefore lacks the control required for moral responsibility for it. (Pereboom e.g., 2014, 2017)

I call this objection the 'disappearing agent argument' because the agent (metaphorically) vanishes at the point at which we expect that she can settle whether the decision occurs. The concern is that because event-causal libertarian agents lack the power to settle which decision occurs, they won't have the role in action that secures the control that moral responsibility requires. I cite the equipoise situation as a paradigm case. Event-causal libertarians generally accept freedom of choice in non-equipoise situations. The worry about settling arises in many such contexts as well.

Mele asks for clarification on what it is for an agent to settle whether a decision occurs. Here is my response (Pereboom 2017): First, to settle whether to A or to not-A, or equivalently, which of A and not-A occurs, is to determine, not necessarily causally, which of these options occurs. In the typical case, what an agent directly aims to settle is not whether a decision occurs; the focus is instead on a bodily motion, such as raising one's arm (e.g., Steward 2012, 32-36), or a mental analogue, such as imagining one's childhood home. The agent then determines that she decides to A by determining to A; I determine that I decide to raise my arm by determining that I raise my arm. In an earlier work, Mele writes: ''in deciding to A, one settles upon A-ing (or upon trying to A), and one enters a state -- a decision state -- of being settled upon A-ing (or upon trying to A)'' (Mele 1992: 158-59).

I suggest (2017) that there is more to the notion of settling than determining whether an action or decision to act occurs. Helen Steward (2012) argues that settling in addition involves difference making -- making the difference as to which option for action occurs. Putting the two together, I've proposed the following characterization:

An agent settles which option for action occurs just in case she determines, not necessarily causally, which action occurs, and she makes the difference as to which action occurs. (Pereboom 2017)

To settle which option for action occurs is an exercise of control in action, and its characteristics are determination and difference making. Mele persuasively argues that this is an exercise of direct control in acting, by contrast, with, say, gathering evidence and weighing reasons concerning how to act. As Mele reports, Meghan Griffith (2010) contends that settling requires complete control, that is, control that precludes any probability of failure. Now if settling requires complete control at all, plausibly it requires the agent's complete control over which decision occurs, not over, say, which consequences of a decision occur. It requires a hockey player's complete control over the decision to shoot the puck at the net, not complete control over whether she actually scores. Against this, Mele suggests that adequate control should allow for a small probability of failure of deciding (174-176), and I think he's right about this.

A crucial point in the discussion is that for the event-causal libertarian, control is a causal matter. Given that on this conception only events can be causes, the control in settling is a matter of events causing the decision at issue. But given the equipoise scenario, the candidates for causing the decision, typically events that involve the agent's beliefs and desires, only render it .5 probable, and thus do not settle its occurrence. At this point the event-causal libertarian might abandon the causal account of control and adopt the sort of non-causalism about settling in effect advocated by Carl Ginet (2007), as Mark Balaguer (2014) does; or else switch to agent-causal libertarianism, according to which agents as substances settle which decision occurs by causing it. Let me note here that agent causalism comes not only in the libertarian variety, developed in recent decades by Timothy O'Connor (2000) and Randolph Clarke (2003), but also in a deterministic version, defended by Ned Markosian (2000), Dana Nelkin, and myself (2015).

Mele does not favor any type of agent causalism. One concern he cites for the libertarian variety is that it can't avoid the problem of present luck -- holding fixed all factors prior to a decision, the decision might have gone either way -- and that certain versions attempt to do so by merely stipulating that exercises of agent-causal power are not a matter of luck (158). I believe that this is close to correct: the agent-causal power is, essentially, the power to settle (Pereboom 2014), and at this point the question is whether it's plausible that we have it. I argue that there's reason to believe that we don't have it in its libertarian version, but that we may possess it in its deterministic form (Pereboom 2015). This is one response to Mele's challenge that if I reject event-causal libertarianism and agent-causal libertarianism, I'm left without an account of settling or of agency (165). Another option left open for me is that settling is secured by event-causal determination or near-determination (allowing for a small probability of failure) of decisions by other agent-involving events, which would facilitate settling if it turns out that all causation is event-causation.

Mele offers the following positive suggestion: First, an agent's deciding does not depend on her being an agent cause, and can be accommodated by an event-causal view. Given this, "if an agent's deciding to A in a case of the kind in question is sufficient for his settling whether he is in one decision state or another, such settling does not depend on agent-causal powers and the disappearing agent argument fails" (166). The thought is that without invoking agent causation, and with the event-causal libertarian view in place, the agent's deciding to A is sufficient for settling which decision occurs. Note that Mele's suggestion is formulated in terms of an agent deciding. A concern that might be raised is that given the commitments of the event-causal libertarian position, this formulation is apt to convey the impression that his suggestion has more credibility than it in fact does. Mele argues, plausibly, that on event-causal libertarian views it remains correct to say that agents, and not events, decide and make decisions. "[Sam] has and exercises the ability or power to sink free throws, and he sinks many of them. His intentions, beliefs, skills, and the like do not sink free throws -- alone or in combination with one another. And that is no surprise, because they are not able to sink free throws" (164). To be sure, retaining ordinary agent talk is legitimate for the event-causal libertarian. The view is not committed to linguistic reform. But it is committed to the metaphysical thesis that all causation is event-causation. Regarding Mele's contention that Sam's "intentions, beliefs, skills, and the like do not sink free throws," it's not open to the event-causal libertarian to affirm that in the sinking of a free throw Sam is a causal influence distinct from Sam-involving events. What's at issue here isn't how we ordinarily speak, but rather the commitments of an event-causal theory of action. And in the equipoise scenario there are no event causes of the agent's decision state, or of the agent's deciding, that settle whether it occurs.

Mele's suggestion resembles an account of settling recently proposed by Randolph Clarke (2017). On Clarke's account, the making of the decision by S at t to A settles whether the decision is made then. He writes: "by 'the making of the decision', what is meant is simply the occurrence of the mental action of deciding. If such a mental action occurs, then a making of a decision takes place; the latter is nothing more and nothing less than -- it is -- the former." (Clarke 2017). Clarke's thought is that the occurrence of the mental action of deciding settles which decision occurs in the sense of making a certain proposition about the decision true (2017, and from correspondence). Now I agree that such a use of 'settling' is fine linguistically. But settling, in the context of the disappearing agent argument, is an exercise of control, and for the event-causal libertarian exercise of control is a causal matter. However, on Clarke's proposal, settling is the making-true relation, which is not a causal relation (Pereboom 2017). Given Mele's resolute causalism, such non-causal accounts of settling are ruled out.

As my partisan discussion indicates, I don't share Mele's optimism about the prospects of event-causal libertarianism. But supposing he's wrong and I'm right, that part of his book is nonetheless highly valuable for clarifying the philosophical dialectic. And the book as a whole is another excellent contribution of Mele's to our understanding of agency and free will.


Balaguer, Mark. (2014). "Replies to McKenna, Pereboom, and Kane," Philosophical Studies 169, pp. 71-93.

Clarke, Randolph (2003). Libertarian Accounts of Free Will, Oxford University Press.

Clarke, Randolph (2017). "Free Will, Causation, and the Disappearing Agent Argument," Noûs, DOI 10.1111/nous.12206

Ginet, Carl (2007). "An Action Can Be Both Uncaused and Up to the Agent," in C. Lumer ed. Intentionality, Deliberation, and Autonomy, Ashgate, pp. 243-56.

Griffith, Meghan (2010). "Why Agent-Caused Actions are Not Lucky," American Philosophical Quarterly 47: pp. 43-56.

Mele, Alfred (1992). Springs of Action. Oxford University Press.

Mele, Alfred (2006). Free Will and Luck. Oxford University Press.

Markosian, Ned (2010). "Agent Causation as the Solution to All the Compatibilist's Problems," Philosophical Studies 157, pp. 383 -- 98.

Nelkin, Dana (2011). Making Sense of Freedom and Responsibility, Oxford University Press.

O'Connor, Timothy (2000). Persons and Causes. Oxford University Press.

Pereboom, Derk (2014). Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life, Oxford University Press.

Pereboom, Derk (2015). "The Phenomenology of Agency and Deterministic Agent Causation," in Horizons of Authenticity in Phenomenology, Existentialism, and Moral Psychology, H. Pedersen and M. Altman, eds.,  Springer, pp. 277-94.

Pereboom, Derk (2017). "Responsibility, Agency, and the Disappearing Agent Objection," in Le Libre-Arbitre, approches contemporaines, Jean-Baptiste Guillon (ed.), Collège de France, 2017, pp. 1-18.

Steward, Helen (2012). A Metaphysics for Freedom. Oxford University Press.