Aspects of Knowing: Epistemological Essays

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Stephen Hetherington (ed.), Aspects of Knowing: Epistemological Essays, Elsevier, 2006, 256pp., $86.95 (hbk), ISBN 0080449794.

Reviewed by Juan Comesaña, University of Wisconsin-Madison


This book is a collection of essays in epistemology. The topics treated by the authors include lotteries, Moore's proof of an external world, the Gettier problem, contextualism and skepticism. In his introductory essay, "The Art of Precise Epistemology," the editor claims that the articles are concerned with the relation between philosophical reflection about knowledge and scientific practice -- with the set of issues that arises from the impetus to "naturalize" epistemology. The book is even divided into two sections, "Epistemology as Scientific?" and "Understanding Knowledge?" I confess to not seeing this concern prominently displayed in any of the papers, however (and it is resolutely absent in most of them), with the possible exception of the editor's own contribution. The editor does point out another unifying property of the papers with which it is easier to agree: all of the authors are Australian. In any case, some of the papers are very interesting indeed, even if they resist integration around a unifying theme. In the rest of this review I will present in some detail the arguments of three of the papers, together with some concerns that can be raised about them. Before doing that, I will briefly summarize the rest of the papers.

In "A Problem About Epistemic Dependence," Tim Oakley argues that the notion of epistemic dependence is very hard to characterize, and that this difficulty raises doubts about the use of the regress argument in epistemology. In "Accounting for Commitments: A Priori Knowledge, Ontology, and Logical Entailments," Michaelis Michael deals with the question of what it is for someone to be committed to a certain proposition. In "Epistemic Bootstrapping," Peter Forrest aims to defend the claim that the property of being warranted if true is a positive epistemic status that beliefs might have, a status which, when noticed, might increase the justification of that belief. In "More Praise for Moore's Proof," Roger White argues that even someone who thinks that Moore's proof cannot represent the way in which we come to be justified in believing in its conclusion should have some nice things to say about the proof. In "Skepticism, Self-Knowledge and Responsibility," David Macarthur examines the interplay of two stances that we can take towards our own beliefs, the "deliberative" stance and the "naturalistic" stance, and how they relate to skepticism. In "A Reasonable Contextualism (or, Austin Reprised)," A. B. Dickerson defends what he calls "Austin's contextualism." In "Contextualism Questioned," Brian Weatherson argues that the behavior of "knows" in questions offers reasons to doubt that "subject contextualism" is true. In "Knowledge by Intention? On the Possibility of Agent's Knowledge," Anne Newstead argues that close attention to fallibilism in epistemology allows us to defend the idea that agents always know what they are doing. In "Gettier's Theorem," John Bigelow presents a taxonomy of possible responses to the Gettier problem. In "Knowledge that Works: A Tale of Two Conceptual Models," Stephen Hetherington argues that a thoroughgoing fallibilism makes some concerns of contemporary epistemologists seem less pressing. I now turn to a (barely) more detailed examination of the three other papers in the collection.

In "Lotteries and the Close Shave Principle," John Collins argues that the impact of the lottery problem has been severely overestimated in the recent literature. Collins starts by describing what he calls the "lottery observation:" that I cannot correctly be said to know that a ticket in a fair lottery with many tickets is a loser (if all the evidence I have for its being a loser is that it is a ticket in a large fair lottery, of course). The lottery observation threatens to become a serious problem if it generalizes beyond official lotteries. Jonathan Vogel has argued that the lottery observation does generalize:[1] in many cases, beliefs that are not about official lotteries can be thought of as being about situations that have the same probabilistic structure as an official lottery. Here is an example from Vogel that Collins considers:

Car Theft : Suppose that several hours ago Smith left his car parked on a side street in a major metropolitan area. Since Smith clearly remembers where he parked the car, we may be inclined to say he knows where his car is. But does he know that his car has not been stolen in the last couple of hours and driven away from where he parked it? Many people would say that he does not.

Why do many people think that Smith doesn't know that his car hasn't been stolen? For the same reason, Vogel argues, that many people agree with the lottery observation:

In effect, when you park your car in an area with an appreciable rate of auto theft, you enter a lottery in which cars are picked, essentially at random, to be stolen and driven away. Having your car stolen is the unfortunate counterpart to winning the lottery. And, just as one doesn't know that one will not have one's number come up in the lottery, it seems one doesn't know that one's number won't come up, so to speak, for car theft.[2]

Collins argues that there are important disanalogies between official lottery cases on the one hand and Car Theft and other alleged generalizations on the other hand. According to Collins, the reason for thinking that the lottery observation is true is that it is entailed by the following principle, which Collins thinks is true:

The Close Shave Principle : If S knows that p, then there is no possibility that is very close to actuality at which p is false and to which S assigns non-zero probability.

Collins' reasoning that the Close Shave Principle explains the lottery observation seems to be the following: in an official lottery case, for any two tickets n and m, the possibility that n wins is as close to actuality as the possibility that m wins, and all of them are very close to actuality (the only difference with actuality being the winning ticket). Therefore, applying the Close Shave principle to an official lottery case gives the result that we cannot know of any ticket that it will lose based solely on the fact that it is a ticket in a fair lottery. Moreover, Collins argues, whatever is going on with Car Theft and similar cases, it cannot be that the reason for our judging that we lack knowledge in those cases is rooted in lottery-style considerations, for the Close Shave Principle doesn't apply to them. Collins admits that it is possible to adorn Car Theft so that, for instance, the thieves really do hold a lottery to determine which car to steal. Collins says that, in that case, he does agree that Smith doesn't know that his car hasn't been stolen -- but he takes this to be further confirmation of the Close Shave Principle.

Although I found Collins' article illuminating, I don't think that the Close Shave Principle is the key to the lottery principle. First, it seems to me that the Close Shave Principle fails to fully explain the lottery observation. Second, there are reasons to think that the Close Shave Principle is false.

First, then, in the paper discussed by Collins, Vogel himself suggested (and Hawthorne later agreed) that our tendency to agree with the lottery observation is not restricted to cases where every ticket has the same chance of winning: "someone may fail to know that his or her ticket will lose in lotteries in which the winning chances of the tickets are uneven."[3] If that is right, then the Close Shave Principle would fail to explain the lottery observation. For suppose that I have ticket number 13 in a lottery that works this way: if any number other than 13 comes up, then that number wins the lottery outright. If 13 comes up, however, then a second lottery is held. Whichever number comes up in this second lottery is the winner. Now, in this case, I do assign a non-zero probability to the possibility of ticket 13 winning, but the possibility where 13 wins is not very close to actuality. Suppose that Hawthorne and Vogel are right that even in that case we will not say that we know that ticket 13 will lose. If so, then the Close Shave Principle fails to explain the lottery observation.

Second, it seems to me that there are reasons to think that the Close Shave Principle is false. The Close Shave Principle is closely related to the safety principle for knowledge advanced (in different versions) by Sosa and Williamson.[4] To a first approximation, a safety principle says that if S knows that p then, in close situations where S believes that p, p is still true. There are now in the literature a number of counterexamples to such safety principles.[5] It seems likely to me that if the counterexamples work against safety principles, then they (or very similar ones) also work against the Close Shave Principle.

The book contains three papers on the Gettier problem. Two of them (one by Adrian Heathcote and the other one by André Gallois) even offer straightforward solutions to the Gettier problem! This is, in one respect, a very healthy development. Philosophical problems shouldn't be abandoned out of sheer boredom, and it is easy to get the impression that boredom was in fact one of the main contributing factors behind the dwindling of the literature on the Gettier problem in the last twenty years. The three papers in this collection are a symptom of the fact that interest in the Gettier problem is picking up again, and that is to be applauded. On the other hand, as was to be expected, I don't think that the proposed solutions work.

In "Truthmaking and the Gettier Problem" Adrian Heathcote argues for the following solution to the Gettier problem:

The K-conditions : X knows A iff X believes A; X is justified in believing A; A is true; and the evidence that X has which constitutes the justification is evidence of the very state of affairs that makes A  true.

Heathcote's proposal is evidently related to the causal theory of knowledge. As such, it inherits some of the causal theory's problems. Heathcote himself notes that it is vulnerable to the fake barns case: you are driving through the countryside and see a number of fake barns that cannot be distinguished, from where you are, from real barns. You believe of each of them that they are (real) barns. As it happens, one of the things that you see is a real barn. Many philosophers think that you do not know that there is a real barn in the field. However, your belief satisfies all of the K-conditions. Heathcote claims that this style of counterexample will yield to taking seriously the fallibility of knowledge. I fail to see how that could help, though. The best deployment of fake-barn style counterexamples doesn't appeal to any theoretical commitment to the infallibility of knowledge, but to the rather more mundane thought that you could have easily been duped, and that in fact you have been duped not one minute ago.

Heathcote's proposal also seems to fall prey to counterexamples against the necessity of a causal condition. Consider, for instance, Brian Skyrms's example (Skyrms (1967)): Fred died of a heart attack, and then his head was cut off. Moments later, you see Fred with his head cut off, and come to believe, and obviously know, that Fred is dead. But, arguably, your belief doesn't satisfy the K-conditions, because you don't have evidence of the heart attack, but of the beheading.

In "Is Knowledge Having the Right to be Sure?," André Gallois argues that the answer is "Yes." Gallois' defense of a descendant of Ayer's proposal is resourceful, but it also has some very strange consequences. For instance, Gallois' proposal doesn't seem to impose any doxastic condition on knowledge -- it's possible to know that p even without believing (or otherwise assenting to) p![6] This defect can be easily remedied by imposing belief as an independent necessary condition, of course. But there are some other concerns that cannot be so easily solved. Gallois argues that knowledge cannot be identified with the right to believe, because "if individuals exercise their right to believe only in Gettier-free situations, they will, very often, fail to form completely justified beliefs," and this is "not a good consequence from an epistemic point of view" (178). Similar things could be said, however, about being sure. If individuals exercise their right to be sure only in Gettier-free situations then they will, very often, fail to be sure when they are completely justified in being sure. This highlights the fact that Gallois hasn't, to my mind, successfully argued that having the right to be sure differs in any significant way from being justified.


Comesaña, J. (2005) "Unsafe Knowledge," Synthese 146, 395--404.

Hawthorne, J. (2004) Knowledge and Lotteries, Oxford University Press.

Neta, R., and G. Rohrbaugh (2004) "Luminosity and the Safety of Knowledge," Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 85, 396--406.

Skyrms, B. (1967) "The Explication of "X knows that p"," Journal of Philosophy 64:12, 373--389.

Sosa, E. (1999) "How Must Knowledge Be Modally Related to What Is Known?" Philosophical Topics 26:1/2, 373--84.

Sosa, E. (2002) "Tracking, Competence and Knowledge," in P. Moser, ed., The

Oxford Handbook of Epistemology, Oxford University Press.

Vogel, J. (1990) "Are there counterexamples to the closure principle?" in M. Roth and G. Ross, eds., Doubting: Contemporary perspectives on skepticism, Kluwer.

Williamson, T. (2000) Knowledge and Its Limits, Oxford University Press.


[1] See Vogel (1990).

[2] Vogel (1990), p. 16, cited by Collins, p. 85.

[3] Vogel (1990), p. 26 n. 9; cited (with an incorrect footnote number) by Hawthorne (2004), p. 9, n. 20.

[4] See Sosa (1999), Sosa (2002) and Williamson (2000).

[5] See, for instance, Comesaña (2005) and Neta and Rohrbaugh (2004).

[6] I note that Gallois wavers on this issue. He says: "Consider the claim that knowing P implies believing P. If one can have the right to be sure that P without being sure that P, what is to prevent having the right to be sure that P without even believing that P? Perhaps something does, but if so, that needs to be shown." In the very next section, however, he goes on to endorse the claim that "[a] necessary condition for S having the right to be sure that P is that S forms her belief in a truth-reliable way" (p.171), which seems to imply that if S has the right to be sure that P then S believes that P.