Assertion: New Philosophical Essays

Placeholder book cover

Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2011, 300pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199573004.

Reviewed by Mikhail Kissine, Université Libre de Bruxelles / F.R.S.-FNRS


This collection stems from a conference on assertion held at the Arché Philosophical Research Centre in St Andrews in 2007, and is organised in two parts.  The first ('What is an Assertion?') contains papers concerned with the impact of the notion of assertion on philosophy of language, whereas the second ('Epistemic Norms of Assertion') is devoted to the connection between assertion and epistemology. In this review, I will mainly focus on contributions that are concerned with the way assertion should be individuated qua speech act.

Broadly speaking, contemporary theories of assertion can be classified into the following four categories (this classification is laid out in the editors' introduction, in Herman Cappelen's 'Against Assertion' and in John MacFarlane's 'What is Assertion?'):

  1. Assertion is individuated by certain norms (truth, justified belief, knowledge . . . ); e.g. Williamson (1996);
  2. Assertion is individuated by certain effects (context update, modification in addressee's beliefs . . . ); e.g. Stalnaker (1978);
  3. Assertion is individuated by certain commitments (to justification, to withdrawal in certain circumstances . . . ); e.g. Brandom (1994);
  4. Assertion is individuated by certain psychological causes (typically, by the intention to communicate a certain mental state); e.g. Bach & Harnish (1979).

Herman Cappelen's thesis is simple: there is no such thing as assertion. His starting point is broadly Austinian: to every illocutionary act -- and assertion is an illocutionary act type -- corresponds a locutionary act, an act of saying something. Hence, argues Cappelen, different kinds of saying are governed by different norms, are performed with different kinds of intentions, cause various types of effects, and lead to various kinds of commitments. Cappelen argues that if assertion were intrinsically governed by a certain norm -- as theories in (i) have it -- it should be impossible to conceive a possible world where assertion could be individuated by an alternative norm (or in some other way). Chess, for instance, is governed by constitutive rules, so, submits Cappelen, the answer to a question like 'Could she have played chess if the rules were that the rook could not move?' is clearly 'No'. Yet, the argument goes, one can agree that she could have asserted that p even though her assertion didn't abide to a certain norm.

However, one can dispute the first intuition that games are constituted by rules: after all, we still understand that Alice plays croquet with the Queen of Hearts, even though the rules are clearly not those constitutive of the game of croquet proper. As for the second part of Cappelen's argument, such questions about assertion are simply questions about the validity of one theory or another: criticising a certain theory of assertion very often amounts to simply trying to find examples of felicitous assertions that nevertheless violate the essential condition posited by the theory at hand. Therefore, it is doubtful that such questions can be answered by appealing to our intuition. It is true, however, that the latter point reminds us how technical the term 'assertion' is -- and this is a criticism Cappelen raises about theories of assertion in general. But many terms of philosophical or linguistic analysis are incomprehensible for the layman: take 'quantifier', 'high tone' or 'noun'. Does this suffice for saying that there is no such thing as a 'quantifier', 'high tone' or 'noun'? (And what about 'photon', 'helium' and 'sub-prime'?).

Cappelen has two more arguments. First, everyday complaints about false, ungrounded or insincere assertions are never termed as rule- or norm-violations. Second, normative theories of assertion cannot accommodate the data about the contextual variability of the norms involved. Although Cappelen explicitly targets only normative theories of assertion, he also contends that all of his arguments can easily be extended to approaches falling under (2), (3) and (4). However, it is unclear how these last two arguments could be extended to non-normative theories.

MacFarlane's 'What is Assertion?' defends the merits of commitment-based theories of assertion against theories (1), (2) and (4). For instance, he argues that only theories of type (3) can account correctly for what it is to retract an assertion. MacFarlane also objects to Bach and Harnish (1979), arguing that by defining assertion in terms of the expression of a certain communicative intention, they make it possible to count informative presuppositions and certain conversational implicatures as asserted contents. However, in Bach and Harnish's account -- and in Austin's theory too, for that matter -- illocutionary acts are constituted by locutionary acts, so that the content of the speech act of assertion is determined by the constitutive locutionary act. In such a way, expressive theories -- the ones in (4) -- can link the asserted content to the linguistic meaning of the sentence used more closely than MacFarlane's criticism suggests.

In 'Information and Assertoric Force', Peter Pagin offers a new and elaborate theory of assertion. For Pagin, for an utterance u to be an assertion it is necessary and sufficient that u be prima facie informative. Pagin gives the following conditions for a state p to give information that q: first, q must be true; second, p and q must belong to two disjoint domains, E and S; third, there must be a function μ from E to S; fourth, there must be a reliable process π, such that, if π selects a member e of E that is true, then μ(e) is true too; and, finally, it must be the case that p is a member of E selected by π, and that μ(p) = q. If one takes E to be a domain of possible utterances and S a domain of propositional contents, the function μ would be a semantic function -- for any utterance u of E, μ selects the content u expresses. If the function μ from the utterance u to a content q is warranted by a reliable process π -- for instance, by the fact that the speaker of u is reliable -- and if q is indeed true, one can say that u gives information that q, or, in other words, one can infer q from the fact that u expresses q. Accordingly, if an utterance is informative, argues Pagin, it is performed partly because the content it expresses is true. Assertions, therefore, are those utterances that the speaker performs partly because their content is true, and that the hearer takes to be performed partly because their content is true.

Of course, assertions can be mistaken or insincere; this is why Pagin defines assertions as being informative only prima facie (viz., as being prima facie performed partly because their content is true). Yet, this qualification still does not solve all the problems. One -- explicitly endorsed -- consequence of this account is that an utterance may be an assertion to one person but not to another: it will be an assertion for only those persons who will treat it as prima facie informative. Imagine that Peter lies to Mary about where he spent the night before; as it happens, Mary has followed Peter and knows the truth. So, from Mary's point of view, Peter's utterance is certainly not prima facie informative and hence should not be, by Pagin's standards, an assertion. Yet lies are insincere assertions; claiming otherwise would make it very hard to explain why the liar can be blamed for violating the sincerity norms associated with assertion. Pagin is of course aware of this problem and attempts to explain it away by appealing to the surface properties of the sentence uttered. Hearers would still treat lies they discover as assertions because the sentence type used is the one usually associated with prima facie informativeness. So, one may ask whether, ultimately, Pagin's theory doesn't turn out to be that assertoric force depends on a conventional link between certain sentence-types and information load.

In a paper ('Conversational Score, Assertion, and Testimony') that aims at better understanding how assertion impacts on conversation and transmits information, Max Kölbel offers a reading of Stalnaker's notion of conversational background as constituted by the propositions the interlocutors accept. Kölbel treats acceptance as a social practice. The main idea is that the conversational moves and rules that govern them determine whether a proposition is accepted or not. This claim left me wondering whether it is possible to define the main conversational moves and rules without using the notion of acceptance. For instance, Kölbel says that if a participant asserts that p and the assertion is not rejected, then p becomes accepted. First, this strongly suggests that the very move of assertion qua linguistic move should be defined, in part, as an attempt to provoke acceptance; second, it makes great sense to say that challenging or rejecting what has been said is, in part, refusing to accept the truth of it. This is, to my mind, a problem for Kölbel's ambition to define conversational background without making reference to the speaker's psychological states. Because Kölbel does not relate acceptance to belief, he rejects the idea that acceptance must be mutual -- in opposition to Stalnaker's theory of assertion -- and defines the conversational background as what participants to the conversation accept.

Following Stalnaker (1978), Kölbel agrees that it is infelicitous to assert a proposition that already belongs to the conversational score. Indeed, if it is mutually manifest that Mary is married, for instance, because you just told me so (and I didn't reject or challenge your assertion), my saying 'Mary is married' would not count as a felicitous assertion. Now, imagine that you just learnt that Mary is married, but that you don't know that I know it (as it happens, I already heard that Mary is married from another source). In such a circumstance, your saying 'Mary is married' is a perfectly felicitous assertion. The price Kölbel has to pay in order to account for this fact is to say that prior to your utterance neither you nor I accepted the proposition 'Mary is married'. While such a claim is compatible with the indications Kölbel provides as to his understanding of acceptance, it also makes 'acceptance' a term of art that has little relation to a naïve, pre-theoretical understanding of the word. Furthermore, on page 61, Kölbel says that if 'it becomes obviously manifest to all participants that p, then the proposition that p becomes accepted'. Imagine that Larry gets in the room, and, because I think that you don't know Larry, I say to you 'This is Larry'. Unbeknownst to me you went to college with Larry, so it is as obviously manifest to you as it is to me that this is Larry. Kölbel's theory wrongly predicts that my assertion 'This is Larry' is infelicitous because its content is accepted by all participants before the utterance is performed.

The idea that the attitude that determines the conversational background must be iterated is actually the starting point of Robert Stalnaker's contribution to the volume, 'The Essential Contextual'. In order to adapt Lewis's (1979) classical account of self-locating knowledge to interpersonal, iterated contexts, Stalnaker argues that it is insufficient to represent the agent's knowledge as a set of compatible centered worlds (viz. of <agent, world> pairs); a center must also be bi-univocally associated with a unique world. According to this account, ignoring one's spatio-temporal location is ignoring the world one is in.

The second part of the book gathers papers that address the issue of epistemic norms of assertion. While much has been said in the literature on the necessary epistemic conditions of assertion, two contributions address the less discussed issue of sufficiency. In 'Fallibilism and the Knowledge Norm for Assertion and Practical Reasoning', Jessica Brown argues that infallibilism is not a good reason to take knowledge as being sufficient for both assertion and practical reasoning. Jennifer Lackey ('Assertion and Isolated Second-Hand Knowledge') adduces several examples where one is not in a sufficient epistemic position to assert a proposition because she knows this proposition by hearsay and knows very little else about it. Such examples show, according to her, that knowledge is not a sufficient condition for assertion.

The necessity direction of the knowledge norm for assertion is criticised by Jonathan Kvanvig ('Norms of Assertion'), who defends a justification norm instead. In 'Putting the Norm of Assertion to Work', Sanford Goldberg claims that the epistemic norm for assertion, whatever it is, also explains the epistemological features of testimony. Patrick Greenough ('Truth-Relativism, Norm-Relativism, and Assertion') assesses knowledge-based theories of assertion in the light of recent relativist theories of truth. In 'Assertion, Norms, and Games', Ishani Maitra takes issue with the analogy between assertion qua norm-governed activity and games: she argues that norms are not related to the games of which they are constitutive in the same way as an alethic or an epistemic norm is supposed to be related to assertion.

To conclude, this collection is valuable reading for anyone interested in speech acts in general and assertion in particular. Each contribution raises a lot of interesting and original questions. In addition to this, the volume reads as a highly homogenous whole, with common threads running across several papers.


Bach, K. and R. M. Harnish (1979). Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge, Mass., MIT Press.

Brandom, R. B. (1994). Making it Explicit. Reasoning, Representing, and Discursive Commitment. Cambridge, Mass., Harvard University Press.

Lewis, D. K. (1979). "Attitudes de dicto and de se." The Philosophical Review 88: 513-545.

Stalnaker, R. C. (1978). "Assertion. " Syntax and Semantics 9. P. Cole (ed.). New York, Academic Press: 315-322.

Williamson, T. (1996). "Knowing and Asserting." The Philosophical Review 105(4): 489-523.