Assertion: On the Philosophical Significance of Assertoric Speech

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Sanford C. Goldberg, Assertion: On the Philosophical Significance of Assertoric Speech, Oxford University Press, 2015, 304pp., $66.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732488.

Reviewed by Brian Montgomery


This is an outstanding contribution to the growing literature on the speech act. Its value lies not only in its new ideas and arguments -- of which there are many -- but also in Sanford C. Goldberg's willingness to methodically examine some of the concepts prevalent in the norm of assertion debate that have yet to receive the much needed scrutiny that he provides. As he tells us at the outset, his goals are twofold: to put the norm of assertion to work in debates within epistemology, mind, language, and ethics; and to argue for a contextually variable norm of assertion that is based largely off of Paul Grice's insights in his "Logic and Conversation". I find much to agree with in all eleven chapters but do find some fault with Goldberg's positive contribution to the norm of assertion debate in the final three chapters. In what follows I will briefly sketch his views on the application of the norm of assertion before moving on to a critical examination of his contextualist argument.

Following Timothy Williamson (2000) and numerous subsequent authors, Goldberg argues that assertion is normative. Unlike Williamson, his argument is based not on linguistic cases but rather, as he outlines in his first chapter, his account's ability to explain a host of features found in assertion that he believes other accounts (e.g. attitudinal, Robert Stalnaker's "common ground" approach, etc.) cannot explain. At this point Goldberg remains agnostic as to which epistemic feature governs assertion and instead argues that if we assume that assertion is the speech act that is uniquely governed by an epistemic norm, then we can show several interesting conclusions. For instance, chapter seven attempts to demonstrate that there is an ethics of belief by first showing an ethics of assertion while using Williamson's belief-assertion parallel as a bridge between the two. Goldberg also uses the normativity of assertion to argue for a non-evidentialist account of testimonial transmission, develop insights into Donald Davidson's theory of radical interpretation, and provide us with a new theory of assertoric content that he sees as stronger than its competitors. This is but a brief survey into the chapters of putting the norm of assertion to work in other areas of philosophy. To be sure, not all of the arguments found in them are successful, but all are interesting nonetheless.

Goldberg's other goal -- to argue for a contextually variable norm of assertion -- is relegated to the last quarter of the book but is no less developed. His case begins in chapter nine with an examination of the problem of disagreement within peer groups, which he believes acts as an undercutting defeater for beliefs, thus precluding knowledge of the matter. Yet, Goldberg reasons, the assertions made within those groups are still permissible. This leads him to advance three theses which, while being apparently true, form an inconsistent triad:

Epistemic Norm of Assertion [ENA]: S must: assert p, only if S satisfies epistemic condition E with respect to p; that is, only if E(S, [p]).

Epistemic Significance of Systematic Peer Disagreement [ESSPD]: Under conditions of systematic peer disagreement regarding the proposition that p, no party to the dispute satisfies E with respect to [p].

Assertions are Warranted even under conditions of Systematic Peer Disagreement [AWSPD]: It is sometimes the case that S asserts that p under conditions of a systematic p-relevant peer disagreement, and yet S's assertion is warranted. (250-1)

To illustrate these theses, Goldberg asks us to imagine a philosophy colloquia where Yang, a philosopher, speaks in front a large group of peers including those that hold theses opposed to the ones that she's defending that day. Goldberg reasons that Yang doesn't know the propositions that she asserts because her justification is undercut as ESSPD predicts it would be. Moreover, her epistemic position to [p] may be so weakened that it fails to meet the minimal epistemic threshold established in ENA. Yet, as AWSPD notes, her assertions appear to be warranted.

While some might conclude from this example that the epistemic relation in the norm of assertion is something weaker than knowledge, Goldberg reasons that there are other lessons to be drawn. So what would a successful explanation of the norm of assertion look like? Goldberg provides three desiderata:

1)    It does not weaken E -- the epistemic standard provided by the norm of assertion -- to the point of irrelevance or insignificance.

2)    It recognizes the strengths of the arguments made on behalf of thinking that E is knowledge, or some other robustly epistemic property (such as knowledge-sufficient justification).

3)    It enables us to regard the relevant class of assertions as broadly warranted despite the fact that few if any speakers have any substantial epistemic credentials to make assertions in this area. (254, Italics in original)

According to Goldberg the answer is that there is no single norm of assertion but, instead, the epistemic relation between assertion and asserter is placed on a continuum based upon the mutual beliefs of the conversational participants. In ordinary contexts where there is a low degree of mutual beliefs, knowledge serves as a "default setting" since the hearer's needs require greater information. In cases where there is a higher degree of mutual belief, like Yang's, less demanding epistemic states are required.

Goldberg sees a parallel between the picture just sketched and Grice's Cooperative Principle which enjoins speakers to, "Make your contribution such as it is required, at the stage at which it occurs, by the accepted purpose or direction of the talk exchange in which you are engaged." (Grice 1989, 256) This principle is, of course, broken down into four Maxims, including the Maxim of Quality, which instructs us to only say that which we believe to be true. Under Goldberg's interpretation Quality is essentially the norm of assertion (a position that I have also defended in Montgomery 2014), with the exact content of the epistemic state that it requires determined by the specifics of the "talk exchange".

While there is much to like about Goldberg's argument, going contextualist about the norm of assertion carries with it some cost, as he notes in his final chapter. Hence, it behooves us to ask whether there is a non-contextualist answer that satisfies Goldberg's desiderata and is broadly Gricean in its nature. If so, then we will have at least a prima facie reason to accept it over the picture drafted above. It seems to me that the data equally fits a picture of the normativity of assertion that is roughly analogous to W.D. Ross's moral intuitionism. According to Ross all moral agents are subject to a series of prima facie moral duties like fidelity, non-malfeasance, and justice. However, sometimes theses duties can conflict with one another, as in a case where a duty to repay a debt would harm my family because of our poor financial situation. Yet this does not mean that there is no right thing to do in this circumstance. Instead, Ross would argue that there is an ultima facie or 'all things considered' duty which wins out in the end. Perhaps in this case my duty to support my family is simply weightier than my duty to reparations. However, neither duty is cancelled out. Instead I am forever bound to both even if the circumstances prevent me from acting on both.

I want to say that something very similar to this happens in the case of assertion. I am in full agreement with Goldberg that there is an epistemic norm of assertion and more specifically that knowledge is the norm of assertion. But I also fear that the literature on assertion has been too narrowly focused on the epistemic requirements of the speech act when the propriety of any given utterance is a rich interplay between various kinds of propriety. Consider the case of parent who tells her child that his crayon drawing is the most magnificent work of art that she has ever seen so as to boost his self-confidence. Here the speaker asserts something that she fails to believe, so she would not meet the minimum requirements for E, but we still judge her assertion as being all things considered justified because of the reaction that her son might have if he heard the truth. Here's another example. Imagine that you and I are discussing the weather. It was raining when you entered your office earlier in the day, and you ask Jack, who has just entered the building, whether it is still raining. It would be altogether improper for Jack to respond with, "Just a drizzle and Io is a moon of Jupiter". Both conjuncts in the example are known by Jack, but the second conjunct is irrelevant and therefore ought to not be uttered even though it satisfies E.

In the examples outlined above we have reasons to assert one way or another, but this does not mean that we are no longer bound to follow potential kinds of assertive propriety (epistemic, politeness, legal, occupational, etc.). Instead, one kind of norm (or possibly a combination of norms) becomes the ultima facie norm that our assertion must conform to. This is obviously too complicated of a process to detail here, but it does at least sound like an initially plausible framework that fits the evidence from Goldberg. Once again, consider the Yang case. Even if we grant that neither Yang nor any members of their audience know the philosophical assertions that they make, then we can still say that the speakers in the room are all things considered justified in making the assertions that they do even if they violate E.

What's more, this picture is also broadly Gricean in nature. Recall that the Cooperative Principle can be divided into the maxims of Quantity, Quality, Manner, and Relevance, along with their various submaxims. Few if any assertions would ever satisfy all of the requirements of the Cooperative Principle. Instead, the right thing to say in almost any situation will violate some Maxims while respecting others. What about Grice's claim that the Quality enjoys a special status amongst the Maxims? Does this mean that it cannot be violated? No. Like Grice I want to argue that Quality is the cornerstone of all the whole Cooperative Principle, but there are times where it is altogether necessary to violate it. Hence, I conclude that the Rossian alternative to Goldberg's theory is also compatible with Grice's work.

Finally, this alternative does as good a job with Goldberg's desiderata for a successful solution to his inconsistent triad as his preferred solution. Although I've expressly endorsed the knowledge norm elsewhere, this solution is neutral to the exact content of E. Nevertheless, it is compatible with whatever epistemic state one fills into ENA. This answer satisfies the second desiderata for the same reason; there is nothing in the model sketched above that undercuts the intuitive case for the knowledge norm. Hence, it trivially respects the arguments that might lead one there. Finally, it holds that speakers in peer groups like Yang's are "broadly warranted" in their assertions even if they are not epistemically warranted in making them. Therefore, Yang can be criticized for her assertions at the epistemic level but not at the ultima facie level. Launching into a full throated defense of this theory would require more space than I have, but I trust that this view is at least as plausible as the one that Goldberg has offered. I would like to know why we should favor one over the other.

None of what I have said in the preceding paragraphs is meant to draw away from the brilliance of this monograph. Goldberg's work will surely be read for decades in both epistemology and the philosophy of language. With Assertion Goldberg only cements this legacy, presenting us with views that deserve to be the starting point of future investigations. Goldberg is an exceptionally clear writer, beginning each section with both a summary of the previous material and an explanation ­of its place in the book's larger scheme. It is this sort of clarity which makes it nearly impossible to get lost in the work even when it is at its most technical. This should be essential reading for those working in either the philosophy of language or epistemology. Philosophers of mind and psychology stand to learn much from it too.


Grice, Paul. 1989. Studies in the Way of Words. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Montgomery, Brian. 2014. "In Defense of Assertion". Philosophical Studies 171: 313-326.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.