Placeholder book cover

Mark Jary, Assertion, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 224pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230573994.

Reviewed by Peter Pagin, Stockholm University


Mark Jary claims that his book is the first monograph on assertion and, as far as I know, he is right. Given the amount of interest this notion has attracted, it is perhaps surprising that this has taken so long. On the other hand, the concept of assertion is located at the intersection of several philosophical disciplines (action theory, speech act theory, (other parts of) pragmatics, semantics, logic, epistemology, philosophy of mind) as well as at the intersection between philosophy and other subjects, such as linguistics and cognitive psychology. This means that to cover assertion from at least the main perspectives, you need to know a fair bit in different disciplines and sub-disciplines. There are not that many people around that fit this requirement. Mark Jary is one who does. In fact, his aim is to cover assertion from the philosophical, linguistic and psychological perspectives. Moreover, Jary aims to combine the perspectives in a unified theory.

Before presenting and discussing this theory, I shall say a bit about what the book does and does not cover, for not even Jary covers it all. He does give a rather brief survey of how assertion has been treated within speech act theory. He spends a chapter on how assertion is related to belief and knowledge. Another chapter is concerned with the philosophical discussion of whether there is a conventional sign of assertion. Chapter five deals with assertion in the context of Stalnaker's idea of common ground and his account of presupposition. The sixth chapter deals with the role of the declarative mood (the term `indicative' is not used) and its relation to assertion. Chapter seven is somewhat more linguistic in character, dealing with a number of content distinctions, where the simple distinction between what is asserted and what is presupposed is complemented/replaced by a number of other distinctions. Chapter eight, which makes up a quarter of the book, is the place where Jary develops the cognitive side of his own account. This is done within the framework of Relevance Theory, while also following some ideas of Stephen Barker. I shall return to this below.

What is left out? The intense debate during recent years about norms of assertion is not covered. Jary does mention Williamson's account in terms of a knowledge norm and GarcĂ­a-Carpintero's alternative norm about providing others with knowledge, but there is no mention of those who claim that the knowledge norm demands too much (or those who question normativity altogether). Likewise, the role of assertion in recent epistemology, as in knowledge ascriptions and in the debate about testimony, is not considered. There is a fair bit about the connection between assertion and truth, but only about the connection that interests Jary, not a more general presentation of connections that other have seen (e.g., in relation to deflationist theories of truth). There is no discussion about the so-called assertion fallacy and appeals to the truth/assertibility distinction (or non-distinction) in philosophy more generally. There is not much discussion of implicature and hardly anything about so-called indirect assertion, although some passages are relevant to that topic. There is nothing about what is known as conditional assertion (the idea that the utterance of a conditional is an assertion of its consequent conditional on the truth of the antecedent). There is also nothing about so-called illocutionary logic, or systems of logic of assertion (which have an assertion operator). And although the idea that assertoric force is strongly connected with the capacity of serving as a premise in an inference, there is no more general discussion about assertion from the point of view of logic, or of logic from the point of view of assertion. Finally, although Jary has much to say about the cognitive side of assertion, empirical science is not really used: we find theoretical/speculative cognitive science rather than reference to psycholinguistic or neurolinguistic studies. All in all, Jary does not aim at encyclopedic coverage of assertion topics; such a book remains to be written.

Still, Jary covers a lot, not just in terms of topics discussed, but also in terms of theories that are included in his own general account. In general, Jary wants it both ways. On topic after topic, he presents two views that are apparently incompatible but strives to find a way of including both in his account. This occurs for the first time in chapter 2, where Jary finds a dilemma (p. 10) between on the one hand recognizing that there are assertions that don't provide the hearer with information (e.g., false ones), and on the other hand taking account of the fact that assertion is important as a social activity because assertions transfer information. The solution in this case consists in appealing to Millikan's notion of proper function (p. 11): the assertion practice exists because it has fulfilled an informative function in the past, even though not all assertions fulfill their own proper function.

The next time such a dilemma arises is in chapter 3, where Jary wants both to explain belief in terms of assertion and to explain assertion in terms of belief. He is influenced by Dummett in wanting the former (pp. 33-36), following the argument that belief must be understood in terms of truth, truth in turn in terms of treating as true, which in turn is done in assertion. On the other hand, assertions derive their meaning from the beliefs they communicate, which indicates that assertion should be explained in terms of belief. Jary's solution is to distinguish different points of view:

The order of explanation with which Dummett is concerned is an issue of conceptual priority. On this view, if we want to give an analysis of the notion of belief, we cannot do so without reference to assertion. (p. 36)

However, from the point of view of explaining how beings "wired up like us" … engage in assertion, the order is best reversed: assertion is most profitably analysed as the expression and communication of belief. (p. 38)

This I find not so easy to embrace. It is not like in scientific theory, where, e.g., a concept of microscopic entities is (conceptually) explained in terms of an (empirical) explanation of macroscopic phenomena where this concept plays a role, for in that case we have an independent grasp of the macroscopic phenomena and just explain their occurrence. Here, it seems, we sometimes explain what belief is in terms of assertion, and sometimes what assertion is in terms of belief, depending on the point of view taken. That this fits into one coherent theory is not so clear.

The next example occurs in chapters 4, 6, and 8, and is central to Jary's cognitive account. It concerns the question whether there is a conventional sign of assertion, and in particular whether the use of the declarative mood (in the main clause of the sentence) is a sign of assertion. Jary discusses the objection from Davidson (that any conventional sign can be misused) and also takes up Dummett's views about assertion-like utterances in theatre plays. But I shall move on to where most of the action is: on the one hand, it is essential to assertion to have a conventional sign, like the declarative mood, but on the other hand, the declarative mood is ambiguous between assertoric, commissive and directive force. For speakers use main clause declaratives for giving promises ('I will be there') and for giving commands ('You will clean the latrines', to use the example from Recanati also used by Jary).

Again, Jary wants it both ways. He says that "To grant that the declarative is force ambiguous, though, is not to accept that it is not a conventional marker of assertoric force" (p. 73). So, how does one combine the views? The obvious way, and the way chosen by Jary, is to say that the declarative mood is primarily a marker of assertoric force, and only under special circumstances does a different force result. There are two interconnected questions about this combination of views.

The first is that we need a further reason for saying that the assertoric force is the default one, rather than, e.g., that directive force is the default force and only when circumstances block directive force (e.g., because of the content of the utterance) do we get assertoric or commissive force. This alternative comes across as absurd, but it is not so clear that the apparent absurdity suffices as a theoretical reason. The issue is not raised by Jary.

The second question is connected with the core of Jary's account. On this account, roughly, to make an assertion that p is to use a form (a declarative sentence) that expresses the content that p, and that, if the circumstances are right, makes the speaker present the proposition that p as true and as something new for the hearer to believe. In Jary's Relevance Theoretic vocabulary: "canonically, assertion is a case of a speaker presenting, by linguistic means, an explicitly expressed proposition as relevant to the hearer (i.e. as relevant to an individual) in its own right." (p. 163)

However, Jary immediately adds:

Assertion cannot be defined thus, though. In order for an utterance to have assertoric force, it must also be subject to the cognitive and social safeguards that distinguish assertion… . It is the applicability of these safeguards that distinguishes assertion both from other illocutionary acts and from other forms of information transfer. (pp. 163-64)

Social safeguards consist in sanctions against misleading assertions, while cognitive safeguards consist in the ability of the hearer to not simply accept what is said but meta-represent the speaker as expressing certain beliefs and intentions (p. 160). It is part of a full account of assertion, according to Jary, that assertions are subject to these safeguards. This also distinguishes assertions from promises and commands, where the proposition is not presented as subject to the hearer's safeguards (p. 161); rejection is not presented as an option for the hearer (p. 73).

The problem is that Jary does not explain how one presents a proposition as subject to the hearer's safeguards, over and above using the declarative (appeal to simple social relations is not enough; for instance, a superior saying that I will clean the latrines may be predicting the result of later commands). This leaves the account of the cognitive mechanisms incomplete, for we are left without a full specification of the conventional mark of assertion. Conventionality and ambiguity are not so easy to combine.

Nonetheless, I think Jary is right that one should look to cognitive mechanisms for an account of assertion (but I am less fond of the talk about social sanctions). I also find much in his account that is both interesting and on the right lines. Unfortunately, space does not permit a richer presentation of the book, in particular of the very interesting chapter seven, concerning main point and relevance.

On the whole (although it should have been better proof-read), the book is well organized and engaging. Jary writes clearly and passionately, and I can recommend the book to anyone with a serious interest in assertion, and not just because it is the first monograph on the topic.