Assessment Sensitivity: Relative Truth and its Applications

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John MacFarlane, Assessment Sensitivity: Relative Truth and its Applications, Oxford University Press, 2014, 344pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682751.

Reviewed by Max Kölbel, ICREA at Universitat de Barcelona


John MacFarlane has not rushed into publication. His book has matured over many years, predecessors and earlier versions have been available from his webpage since 2002, and many aspects of his emerging views have already appeared in numerous journal articles or contributions to collections. However, MacFarlane has here forged the results of his research on relativism into a systematic and well-rounded monograph. This cannot have been an easy task, given that the field has developed enormously during those 12 years, including MacFarlane’s own views. The result is a masterful book that is both more original and more carefully crafted than the average contemporary philosophy book.

Assessment Sensitivity defends the view that “relativism about truth can be made philosophically intelligible” and that “it is a good tool for understanding parts of our thought and talk that fall short of being fully objective” (p. v). The way relativism about truth is made intelligible and put to use is highly distinctive and original. It involves introducing a broadly semantic framework and exemplifying its explanatory advantages. I say “broadly” semantic because the framework goes beyond a narrowly semantic framework for a compositional specification of semantic values. In fact, the most distinctive feature of the framework, namely assessment sensitivity, is a semantic feature only in a broad sense. Assessment sensitivity is a feature that emerges only when narrow semantics is used to explain or predict certain wider aspects of our assertoric use of language. MacFarlane operates with semantic values and semantic contents that he shares with some of those theorists who do not countenance assessment sensitivity and are therefore not “relativists about truth” in his sense (p. 65).

The book falls into two main parts: “Foundations”, which sets out the assessment sensitivity framework in some detail and locates it within a landscape of competing views; and “Applications”, which demonstrates and illustrates the usefulness of this framework when it is applied to five distinct areas of thought and language: matters of personal taste, knowledge ascriptions, future contingents, epistemic modality and deontic modality. I shall mostly explain the assessment sensitivity framework, as it is presented in part I, but this will naturally allow me to discuss some of the applications that are discussed in part II.

In describing the framework, it is useful to distinguish the more narrowly semantic component, i.e. MacFarlane’s proposed formal semantics, and the component that concerns what MacFarlane calls the “postsemantics” and the “pragmatics”, which contains MacFarlane’s distinctive ideas, about how the semantics figures in an explanation of thought and talk.

The narrowly semantic component involves an idea that is now standardly taken into consideration1, even though it remains controversial: the idea that semantic contents may vary in their extension not only with a possible world but also with some other factors, such as a location, a time, a thinker, a standard of taste, an information state etc.

Thus, to take MacFarlane’s central example, the sentence:

(1) Licorice is tasty.

can be seen as expressing a semantic content -- a proposition -- the truth-value of which varies with a standard of taste. This proposition is also the content of the belief you express if you use sincerely the sentence and the content thereby asserted. As far as the expressions involved are concerned, the variability of truth-value of the proposition is derived from a variability in the extension of the predicate "is tasty" (p. 150): in addition to depending on the more familiar factors such as a world, a time and an assignment function (that assigns values to variables), the extension of "is tasty" at a context depends on a gustatory standard. ([["is tasty"]]c<w,t,g,a>= {x|x is tasty-according-to-g at w and t})

MacFarlane leaves open how exactly the clauses defining the extensions of expressions in context bear on the contents of sentences or the beliefs thereby expressed. For he makes clear that the contents of beliefs are not merely intensions, i.e. functions from indices to truth-values (or equivalently: sets of indices). But he stipulates that the content of a sentence at a context has a unique intension, namely the function from indices to those truth-values that the semantics assigns to the sentence for that context and those indices (p. 152). In other words, the contents of sentences at contexts, and of the beliefs expressed by them at those contexts, are only partially described by specifying their intensions. Without giving us a full account of propositions, MacFarlane aligns himself with those who oppose propositions that are mere intensions (functions from indices to truth-values) or sets of indices.

One manifestation of this general policy is MacFarlane’s semantics of belief ascriptions (p. 156). For example, the sentence “John believes that licorice is tasty.” has relational structure; i.e. “believes” is a transitive verb that takes a “that”-clause as complement. The “that”-clause in turn has as its extension at a given context the content that the sentence to which “that” is prefixed would have at that context. If contents were simply identified with intensions, then this relational semantics of “believes” would be equivalent to a treatment of “believes” as an intensional operator. However, MacFarlane explicitly contrasts his approach with such a treatment “as a modal operator” (p. 156).

There is a certain oddity in the fact that MacFarlane’s contents are not determined by the sample semantic clauses he provides (see above) but are merely constrained by them. His formal semantics is a mere definition of denotation or extension at a context and index; or in other words, it is a definition of the function [[x]]c<w,t,g,a>. Given that he thinks that belief-contexts are hyperintensional, this means that a formal semantics as outlined in the sample clauses will either remain incomplete (by leaving out a treatment of, e.g., belief contexts) or be noncompositional: the denotations, e.g., of “that”-clauses, cannot be derived from what the semantics says about the constituent expressions of “that”-clauses. One could (somewhat feebly) justify the oddity on Macfarlane’s behalf by arguing that the main focus of his book is the coherence and usefulness of making the extensions of expressions depend on extra parameters in the index, such as a standard of taste or an information state, and to exploit these dependencies within a MacFarlanian relativist postsemantics and pragmatics. The issue of whether contents are structured, and if so, what exactly being structured amounts to, is a further and to some extent independent question that MacFarlane is not aiming to answer (see p. 72). So we can leave it as a task for a future compositional semantics involving structured contents to build dependence on the extra evaluation parameters into its semantic clauses.

So much for the narrowly semantic component of MacFarlane’s framework: he operates with a formal semantics that defines denotation in such a way that it can vary with both a context and an index (double-index semantics) but with indices (circumstances) that include non-standard parameters, such as standards of taste. In addition, he superimposes richer (structured) contents (propositions in the case of sentences) that are merely constrained by the formal semantics (p. 151). The need for extra parameters in the index is controversial and competently defended. But as MacFarlane never tires to point out: the distinctive step that makes for assessment sensitivity (and for relativism in his sense) goes beyond these narrowly semantic claims and concerns certain complementary theories that make use of the semantics. As MacFarlane says, “it is not the kind of parameters to which one relativizes propositional truth that makes one a relativist, but rather what one does with them.” (52).

What are these complementary theories? They are theories that make predictions, or offer explanations, of the “proprieties for use” of sentences. On a simple such theory, like David Lewis’s, it is proper assertorically to use a sentence s only if s is true at the context c at which s is used and the index <wat> that is the index of that context c. On a simple theory like Kaplan’s, it is proper to use sassertorically only if the content expressed by s at the context c at which s is used is true at the index (“circumstance”) of c. MacFarlane argues that these accounts will not allow us to predict certain patterns of “proprieties for use”, while his own account can.

In describing accounts that predict proprieties of use on the basis of narrowly semantic properties, MacFarlane distinguishes the “postsemantics” from the “pragmatics”: the postsemantics is simply a definition of a truth notion for sentences in terms of the notion of truth used in the semantics. Thus, for example, Kaplan’s postsemantics defines the truth of a sentence s at a context c (an “occurrence”) as the truth of the content of s at c when evaluated at the circumstance of evaluation of c (Kaplan 1977/89, p. 522, 547). A pragmatic theory articulating how language is properly used will then employ the notion of truth defined in the postsemantics. Thus, a pragmatic theory might employ Kaplan’s definition of the truth of a sentence at a context and say that one may use a sentence assertorically only when it is true at the context of that use.

Much of MacFarlane’s expository and argumentative attention is focused on the appropriate postsemantics: he believes that a Kaplanian postsemantics (as above) will not do and that we need instead a relativist postsemantics:

Relativist Postsemantics. A sentence S is true as used at a context c1 and assessed from a context c2 iff for all assignments a, S is true at c1, <wc1 , tc1 , gc2 , a>, where wc1 is the world of c1, tc1 the time of c1, and sc2 is the aesthetic standard of the agent of c2. (adapted from p. 67)

However, as MacFarlane himself points out (pp. 105, 107-8), even the Relativist Postsemantics does not guarantee that there is genuine assessment sensitivity unless it is combined with norms for the use of language that make essential use of the context of assessment mentioned in the Relativist Postsemantics. MacFarlane’s final pragmatic proposal combines two pragmatic norms concerning assertion:

Reflexive Truth Rule. An agent is permitted to use a sentence s assertorically at context c1 only if s is true as used at c1 and assessed from c1. (p. 103)2

Retraction Rule. An agent in context c2 is required to retract an (unretracted) assertoric use of sentence s made at c1 if s is not true as used at c1 and assessed from c2. (p. 108)

Let us look at one of MacFarlane’s examples to see how these rules operate. Suppose Yum likes licorice and Yuk dislikes it. Now Yum uses sentence (1) (“Licorice is tasty”). A datum that it would be good to predict is that it is correct for Yum to use (1) and incorrect for Yuk to use the very same sentence. And we do get that prediction: Given the semantic clause for “tasty” that we have seen above, (1) is a sentence whose extension is invariant with respect to the context argument of the function [[x]]c<w,t,g,a>, but will vary with the world parameter w, the time parameter t and the gustatory taste parameter g. If we apply the Relativist Postsemantics and the Reflexive Truth Rule, we see that one is permitted to use (1) assertorically only at a context c if the gustatory taste of the agent of c approves of the taste licorice has in the world and time of c. If Yum uses (1), then the agent of the context is Yum, and Yum’s gustatory taste approves of the taste of licorice at the world and time of the context. So Yum is permitted to make this assertion. However, Yuk’s gustatory taste does not approve of the taste licorice has at the world and time of the context, so he is not permitted to use the sentence assertorically. Datum predicted.

A second datum that MacFarlane would like to predict is this: suppose after her initial use of (1), Yum were to undergo a transformation after which her gustatory taste disapproves of licorice. Then she would, after the transformation, be required to retract the initial assertion. The retraction is supposed to be an act directed at the earlier speech-act of assertion that Yum effected by her use of (1). With the help of the Retraction Rule, we also get this prediction: the Relativist Postsemantics makes the truth of a sentence as used at c1 and assessed at c2 be the value of [[(1)]]c<w,t,g,a>, for c1, <wc1 , tc1 , gc2 , a>:so it is the gustatory taste relevant at the context of assessment that is relevant for any obligations to retract specified by the Retraction Rule. After her transformation, in context c2, Yum has a gustatory taste that disapproves of licorice, so in c2 she is obliged to retract her initial assertion.

There are further data that this account can predict: that Yuk can respond (correctly) to Yum’s initial (correct) utterance by saying “No, that is not true.”, or “No, licorice is not tasty.”; that Yum and Yuk are disagreeing in the right sense of “disagree”; data concerning embedding under operators like "By all standards. . . . "; etc.

These are, somewhat simplified, the central claims of the book, exemplified with the central type of example. There are, of course, four further types of application (knowledge ascriptions, epistemic modals, future contingents and deontic modals) and a wealth of important and subtle observations that illuminate each area as well as the nature of semantics and the explanation it can generate. This review cannot do justice to them except by praising the excellent quality, in general, of virtually all the discussions. However, I would like to conclude this review with two critical remarks that concern those aspects of the book that I have outlined.

The first critical point concerns the emphasis MacFarlane puts on what he calls the “postsemantics”, i.e. a definition of truth for propositions or sentences at contexts, which will then be employed by a pragmatic characterization of the norms of assertion. It seems to me that this focus is distracting. As MacFarlane’s own discussion shows (pp. 107-8), even a Relativistic Postsemantics in MacFarlane’s style does not yet cross “the really interesting line” (p. 89) between genuine relativism and contextualism. We need, in addition, a pragmatic norm, like the Retraction Rule, that exploits the extra argument place for contexts of assessment. However, the pragmatic rules in question can all be articulated easily (and perhaps more transparently) without employing a derived notion of truth (“postsemantics”). Thus, MacFarlane’s own distinctive pair of pragmatic norms can be articulated without relying on any postsemantic truth definition:

Reflexive Truth Rule* (or better: Assertion Rule). An agent is permitted to use a sentence s assertorically at context c only if, for all assignments as is true at c and <wctc, gca> (where wc is the world of ctc is the time of cgc is the standard of taste of the agent of c at the time of c).

Retraction Rule*. An agent in context c2 is required to retract an (unretracted) assertoric use of sentence s made at c1 if s is not true at c1 and <wc1tc1, gc2a> (where wc1 is the world of c1tc1 is the time of c1gc2 is the standard of taste of the agent of c2 at the time of c2).

In my view, this articulation of the view would make it more transparent where MacFarlane locates the really interesting dividing line beyond which the label “relativism” begins to be deserved, in his view. He might then say that the important dividing line is the one beyond which the normative status (i.e. as permissible or obligatory) of the use of a sentence is not absolute but depends on the situation in which its status is assessed. This characterization would also carry over to the four other applications of assessment sensitivity. However, truth, on this proposed simplification, would no longer be centre-stage.

As far as I understand, in §5.1 MacFarlane sets up an obstacle to my proposed simplification: the Dummett-Davidson doctrine that the notion of truth must be assumed as a primitive in a truth-conditional characterization of meaning. But it is not clear that this doctrine needs to be respected (see Kölbel 2001, 2009 or Burgess 2012 for discussion), nor is it clear that MacFarlane’s postsemantic detour really respects the doctrine: his subsequent discussion (in §5.2 onwards) starts with a defined two-place notion of sentential truth and ends up with a defined three-place notion of sentential truth. Neither of these seem to fit the Dummett-Davidson bill.

The second critical point concerns MacFarlane’s treatment of the rival position of non-indexical contextualism (NIC). Much of the debate surrounding contextualism and relativism locates the “really interesting line” elsewhere, namely at the point where unusual extra parameters are added to the index (to give just four good examples from an enormous pile: Recanati 2007; Stephenson 2007; Cappelen and Hawthorne 2009; Dowell 2011). Thus one dividing line that has at least generated much discussion is the line between what MacFarlane calls indexical and non-indexical contextualism respectively. The important difference between the two is that while indexical contextualism (IC) will say that Yum’s initial use of (1) expresses a different content from a use that Yuk might have made of the same sentence, NIC says that the content would be the same.

MacFarlane correctly acknowledges this difference and applauds NIC for its claim that the content would remain invariant between Yum’s and Yuk’s use. But in much of the discussion, the difference is downplayed and the two views are lumped together as views that adopt a “contextualist postsemantics” (p. 67). A key passage that criticizes NIC reads as follows:

The important thing to see is that [NIC] would have much in common with more standard forms of contextualism. To be sure, it would disagree with ordinary contextualism about the contents of aesthetic claims. But [1] it would agree with ordinary contextualism on every question about the truth of sentences, and like standard contextualism [2] it would give every use of a proposition an absolute truth value. It would remain on the safe side of the really interesting line — the line between use sensitivity and assessment sensitivity. (p. 89)

The first critical point offered here [1] seems to be wrong: it is not difficult to find examples of sentences on the truth-value of which the two do not agree (even if we are talking about the truth of sentences in MacFarlane’s favoured sense). For example, if Yuk responds to Yum’s utterance of (1) by using the sentence “What Yum said is true.”, then NIC will say that Yuk’s response is not true at the context of use, while IC will say that it is. The second critical point [2] is simply a red herring: perhaps the two positions would give uses of propositions absolute truth-values in MacFarlane’s framework, which speaks, slightly artificially, of “uses” of propositions. But the non-indexical contextualist’s propositions will differ precisely from the indexical contextualist’s in that their truth (at the actual world) is not absolute but relative to something.

Another complaint, on p. 70, is that non-indexical contextualists cannot articulate notions of logical equivalence analogous to MacFarlane’s “absolute” and “diagonal” notions and are therefore forced to say that “It’s tasty.” and “It’s tasty to me.” are logically equivalent. This objection also misses its target. Whether it is problematic to claim that the two sentences are logically equivalent depends on how “logical equivalence” is defined. But clearly, the nonindexical contextualist can easily define analogous absolute and diagonal notions that allow her to differentiate the two sentences in a way completely analogous to MacFarlane’s own.3

There are more criticisms, here and there, of NIC, which cannot all be discussed here. However, readers sympathizing with NIC could be forgiven for thinking that in the end there is only one predictive difference between NIC and MacFarlanian relativism: the latter predicts that after the change in constitution Yum must retract her earlier assertion, while the former makes no such prediction (see the analogous Joey case on p. 109).

However, if this were indeed the only predictive difference (and MacFarlane’s frank remarks on pp. 107-8 suggest this), then one could mount the following objection. The non-indexical contextualist (unlike the indexical contextualist) can say that Yum, once her gustatory taste has changed to disapprove of licorice, is no longer (according to the Reflexive Truth Rule) permitted to use sentence (1) and that she is now permitted to use its negation “Licorice is not tasty.” While according to NIC nothing was wrong with Yum’s original assertion (it complied with the Reflexive Truth Rule), certain social or ethical norms may now require her to deny what she once asserted, at least if she finds herself in company of her original audience or with an audience who are in danger of relying on the earlier assertion.

MacFarlane makes clear that he believes that there is a good sense of retraction where merely denying what was earlier asserted does not amount to a proper retraction. Retraction, he argues, is an act specifically directed at the earlier act of assertion. However, the sympathizer with NIC may wonder whether our impression that Yum is required to retract her earlier assertion is not sufficiently explained by her now being permitted (by the Reflective Truth Rule) to deny what she asserted earlier and at the same time being morally required to clarify to any potential victims of her earlier assertion that she is no longer behind the claim.

Supposing, as we are, that the retraction datum is the only datum that requires assessment sensitivity (and genuine MacFarlanian relativism), it would seem that this alternative explanation by the sympathizer with NIC offers an easy alternative that allows one to stay this side of the “really interesting line”.


Cappelen, Herman and John Hawthorne (2009). Relativism and Monadic Truth. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dowell, Janice (2011). A Flexibly Contextualist Account of Epistemic Modals. Philosopher’s Imprint 11, no. 14.

Kaplan, D. (1977/1989). On Demonstratives. in J. Almog, J. Perry and H. Wettstein (eds), Themes from Kaplan (1989), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 481-563.

Kölbel, Max (2001). Two Dogmas of Davidsonian Semantics, Journal of Philosophy 98, 613-5.

Kölbel, Max (2008). Truth in Semantics, in Midwest Studies in Philosophy 32, 242-57.

Recanati, François (2007). Perspectival Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Stephenson, Tamina (2007). Judge dependence, epistemic modals, and predicates of personal taste. Linguistics and Philosophy 30, 487-525.

1 Thanks to recent debates about contextualism and relativism (and in large measure to MacFarlane himself), as well as about de se or centered content.

2 MacFarlane’s reflexive truth rule, and the retraction rule on pages 103 and 108 respectively are actually rules concerning the contexts in which one is permitted/obliged to assert/retract the assertion of some proposition. I have adapted the rules to concern the assertoric use of sentences in order to avoid a number of complications concerning the version of relativist postsemantics for propositions:

(18)  A proposition p is true at as used at c1 and assessed from c2 iff p is true at all circumstances of evaluation compatible with hc1, c2i. (p. 90)

There is simply no room in this review for explaining the unsimplified version.

3 For example:

Absolute logical equivalence: two sentences S and T are diagonally logically equivalent iff for every c, <w, t>, S is true at c, <w, t> iff T is true at c, <w, t>.

Diagonal logical equivalence: two sentences S and T are diagonally logically equivalent iff for every c, <w, t>, where <w, t> is the index of c, S is true at c, <w, t> iff T is true at c, <w, t>.