Passions and Projections: Themes from the Philosophy of Simon Blackburn

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Robert N. Johnson and Michael Smith (eds.), Passions and Projections: Themes from the Philosophy of Simon Blackburn, Oxford University Press, 2015, 276pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198723172.

Reviewed by Teemu Toppinen, University of Helsinki


Simon Blackburn's 'Apologia pro Vita Sua' -- opening this volume, together with an introduction from the editors, Robert N. Johnson and Michael Smith -- is an elegant, concise account of his philosophical career thus far. Considerably less elegantly, and somewhat more concisely still: you combine an analytical training in Cambridge with an (at the time) unfashionable engagement with Hume's and Ramsey's naturalistic/pragmatist accounts of causation and probability, then take these ideas to the 'ethics laboratory' for easier testing, and finally end up developing the test results in response to considerable critical reaction, coating them -- but not thereby messing them up -- with a carefully administered dose of minimalism about truth, facts, etc. As is well known, the results -- Blackburn's quasi-realist research program -- have been most impressive and influential. Peter Railton (p. 210) puts it nicely in his contribution to the volume:

Drawing upon his knowledge of philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, and metaphysics, Blackburn showed how greatly meta-ethics could benefit from philosophical sophistication in these collateral areas. And at the same time, he showed how meta-ethics thus enriched could become an area of inquiry critical for understanding meaning, mind, and modality more generally.

Written by a distinguished bunch of philosophers, this wonderful book collects together fourteen papers on various aspects of Blackburn's work. The papers cover what seems like a fitting selection of topics. They are polished, and many of them are a real joy to read. Several of the chapters also seem to make substantial contributions to the relevant discussions, at least judging from the metaethicsy papers that deal with issues I know something about.

The book contains chapters by Louise Antony (folk psychology), Helen Beebee (causation for quasi-realists), Frank Jackson (beliefs about particular things), C. S. I. Jenkins (knowledge for quasi-realists), Robert Kraut (quasi-realism about artistic expression discourse), Rae Langton (knowledge of the categorical properties that 'fill in space'), Cynthia Macdonald (primitivism about color), Huw Price (global expressivism), James Dreier (quasi-realism and T. M. Scanlon's view), Allan Gibbard (can we do it all with just passions?), Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons (making sense, in ethics, of 'I might be fundamentally wrong'), Railton (the split between cognition and passion), Mark Schroeder (the Frege-Geach problem and the higher-order attitude accounts), and R. Jay Wallace (expressivism and reasons thought).

I'll first discuss certain themes that span much of the volume, highlighting some of the uses to which Blackburn's ideas are put in the articles, and defending Blackburn against some of the more critical contributions. I then close by very briefly describing the remaining papers.

Dreier's chapter ("Another World: The Metaethics and Metametaethics of Reasons Fundamentalism") provides a fruitful starting point. Dreier asks how we should we explain the connection between normative thought and action and considers, in the light of this issue, the relationship between Scanlon's view, according to which "there are irreducible, non-natural normative facts . . . about normative properties" (p. 155), and quasi-realism. Let's assume that someone who thinks that she ought to perform an action, φ, will, if she is rational, also intend to φ. Call this thesis practicality. This thesis may seem obviously true. But Dreier rightly insists that even obvious truths may be in need of explanation, and that practicality is a case in point. One might suggest that practicality simply follows from the essence of rationality, but Dreier proposes -- plausibly, to my mind -- that we should find a deeper explanation for how the different requirements of rationality hang together. He writes:

Without committing to any full-blown theory of rationality, we might say that states are rationally tied together when they may in fact fail to be linked causally, but only because of some kind of systemic failure, the failure of a process that must normally . . . be in place in order for the states to be the kind of states that they are.

Given practicality, it should then be "part of the essential role of a normative judgment that it motivates" (p. 164). This fits nicely with expressivism. And this is also something that Scanlon is willing to accept. But Scanlon thinks that his view differs from expressivism in that, on his view, normative judgments are genuine, truth-apt, beliefs. The problem now is, of course, that a quasi-realist expressivist such as Blackburn is likely to agree that normative judgments are genuine, truth-apt, beliefs. It's now very unclear what the difference is supposed to be between Scanlon's reasons primitivism and quasi-realism.

Dreier quickly outlines his own preferred way of drawing the distinction: the explanation explanation. Roughly: a realist explains normative thought, with its essential features (e.g., practicality), with reference to normative properties; for a quasi-realist, what it is to think normative thoughts is nothing over and above being in a state, the nature (e.g., functional role) of which may be completely characterized without appeal to normative reality. A quasi-realist doesn't deny that normative properties, beliefs and facts exist. Nothing 'quasi' about them; they are the real deal. They just don't play certain kinds of explanatory roles, ascribed to them by the realist. Interestingly, by this account, Scanlon may turn out to be a quasi-realist. (Indeed, he seems to admit this much -- see Scanlon 2014, p. 52, n. 62.)

Dreier's explanation explanation suggests a local expressivist view. In some cases we explain the relevant judgments without reference to the properties that they are about; in other cases we don't. Price ("From Quasi-Realism to Global Expressivism -- and Back Again?") argues that expressivists should go global. Price agrees that some areas of thought are representational in a way that some others aren't. But there's also a unified level of explanation, he suggests, which allows us to explain why the relevant discourses work the way they do -- for instance, why we put expressions of "attitudes into 'assertoric' form" and subject "them to community-wide norms of truth and assertibility" (p. 142). So, "Level 1" explanations explain why, say, normative and descriptive language work the way they do (perhaps this allows us to coordinate our attitudes in collectively beneficial ways). And "Level 2" explanations tell us "what distinguishes one vocabulary from another" (p. 144) (some have representational functions, others don't).

Price defends global expressivism from worries raised by Blackburn in relation to a view, according to which -- roughly -- we may, for any discourse, explain why we go in for it without appealing to what it is about. It's tricky, though, to see how exactly quasi-realist views understood along the lines suggested by Dreier and Blackburn relate to Price's globalism. In questioning global expressivism, Blackburn seems to be targeting a view that doesn't appeal to representational relations at any 'Level'. But Price, whose primary focus seems to be at Level 1, should have no objections to this.

The division between the practical and (in some robust sense) representational states seems essential, then, to Dreier's explanation explanation, as well as to a plausible form of global expressivism. Railton ("Just How Do Passions Rule? The (More) Compleat Humean") is happy to operate with this kind of division, but argues that the way in which Blackburn (1998) maps this distinction onto a distinction between 'Apollonian' cognition and 'Dionysian' passion is misguided. A 'compleat Humean', Railton says, treats both 'cognitive' and 'practical' states as belonging to the side of the passions, although the functional role that these sentiments play, respectively, are different.

Railton then discusses Blackburn's claim that separating the cognitive input from the practical output is essential to criticizing the ways in which we categorize the world when using thick normative concepts (of chastity or cuteness, say). In Railton's view, this claim is also at work in Blackburn's criticism of 'Cornell realism'. Blackburn imagines a community of teenagers applying the word 'fat↓' to overweight people whom they disapprove of on account of their being overweight. He then suggests that by the Cornell realists' lights, we should accept that 'fat↓' refers to overweight people, and that many of the teenagers' 'fat↓'-judgments are true. We'd also be completely missing the point of their use of 'fat↓', it would seem -- failing to account for the 'special take' on the world that is involved in using the term. Railton's answer, I take it, is to say, very roughly, that what property the teenagers' are referring to when talking about fatness↓ is -- if what is at issue is a normative judgment -- a matter of what properties warrant the relevant kind of negative reaction. It now becomes a substantive normative matter what the teenagers are referring to. Given that merely being overweight does not warrant disapproval, the teenagers' judgments will be false. Moreover, Railton suggests, given that the teenagers must also be thinking of their own reactions as warranted, we can account for the 'special take'. These moves might enable criticism of the thickly normative ways of seeing the world. But it's not clear, at all, how they would help the Cornell realist with accounting for what's special about normative ways of thinking -- which, I take it, is Blackburn's main concern in relation to the Cornell view. We'll now want to know how claims about what's warranted work, and so it seems that no progress would have been made, really, in relation to Blackburn's main concern.

Dreier's and Railton's papers nicely bring out the fact that quasi-realists and the self-proclaimed realists agree on a lot. But the thought that quasi-realists deny that there are any facts, really, when it comes to the areas of thought given quasi-realist treatment, lingers in some of the chapters. Wallace ("The Fugitive Thought: Blackburn on Reasons") opens his article, worryingly, writing: "Simon Blackburn believes that there are no mind-independent normative facts" (p. 246), and suggesting that a quasi-realist such as Blackburn would be "obviously committed to denying, at least while occupying the philosopher's armchair, that there are any reasons for action" (p. 247). But nothing like these denials follow from quasi-realism, understood in terms of something like Dreier's explanation explanation.

Wallace offers an otherwise nice account of Blackburn's project, and raises a pair of good challenges concerning Blackburn's account of reasons talk, but the mistaken construal of the quasi-realist project reappears at a crucial juncture in the argument. Suppose that Molly's being in distress is a reason for Sally to desist. On Blackburn's view, to think this is to endorse a certain kind of movement of (Sally's) mind: her intending to desist upon her learning of Molly's distress. Wallace's first worry is that this account doesn't do justice to Sally's deliberative perspective, or to the fact that the relevant reasons claim concerns Sally's reasons. Wallace proposes a fix: one could say that to think that there's reason for Sally to desist is, roughly, to endorse, for the case of being in Sally, desisting (this kind of move is familiar from Gibbard 2003). Wallace now asks: why think that this is an account of a judgment concerning Sally's reasons rather than our own reasons for welcoming Sally's desisting? But this doesn't seem like a worrying question. Thinking the latter may be taken to amount to endorsing, for the case of being in one's actual circumstances, Sally's desisting. On Wallace's view, a non-expressivist escapes the problem because she can "reflect directly" on the "reasons that people in that situation have for behaving in certain ways" (p. 259). But an expressivist can say just the same thing. That is, she can endorse, for the case of being in circumstances of the relevant kind, desisting, and base her endorsement of desisting, for the case of being Sally, on this. A quasi-realist doesn't deny the existence of mind-independent facts about reasons, and she may appeal to such facts in explaining other normative facts.

Wallace's other worry about expressivism is that it leaves no action-guiding role for normative judgment. He points out that judgments about what there's reason to do should be treated as first-order judgments concerning action (endorsing φ-ing, given p), rather than as higher-order attitudes toward certain kinds of movements of mind. But this, he notes, collapses normative thought "into the process that it was meant to be guiding" (p. 264). However, one might treat a judgment about reasons for action (roughly) as involving an endorsement of performing any actions with some property, K, in which case the judgment could guide forming an intention to perform some action, φ, believed to be K. Wallace objects that such more general policies, too, are guided by people's judgments about reasons. However, given that such chains of justifications must come to an end somewhere, this doesn't seem problematic.

Kraut ("The Metaphysics of Artistic Expression: A Case Study in Projectivism") proposes -- in a paper dealing, refreshingly, with aesthetics -- that talk about what artworks express (e.g., 'Rothko's Tan and Black on Red expresses tragedy, ecstasy, and doom') functions to express invitations to experience artworks in one way rather than another. The thought is that this way we can make sense of talk about artistic expression as somehow 'legitimate', while rejecting, with Eduard Hanslick and Igor Stravinsky, among others, the thought that artworks have, strictly speaking, any expressive properties. Just a few quick points: First, the Kraut-style approach seems primarily normativist (treating claims about artistic expression as claims concerning how to experience art) rather than specifically expressivist. Second, the account needs some fleshing out, as even Stravinsky would invite us to experience artworks in certain ways, but it's not plausible that he should thereby be interpreted as making claims about what these artworks express (he thinks they don't have any expressive properties). Third, I've suggested that quasi-realists should not be seen as being in the business of denying the existence of any relevant properties. But even if the quasi-realist does deny this -- Kraut has a proposal regarding how to do this -- this should not have any impact on substantive commitments about the relevant area of discourse. Adopting a quasi-realist view in ethics in no way provides grounds for accepting nihilism. Likewise, then, adopting a quasi-realist approach to artistic expression does not give one any grounds for siding with Stravinsky. On Kraut's view, agreeing with Stravinsky amounts to having certain attitudes concerning how to experience artworks. But no commitment to such attitudes follows from quasi-realism itself.

A quasi-realist, proper, should also be able to account for the possibility of knowledge concerning the areas of discourse that she's a quasi-realist about. Jenkins ("What Quasi-Realists Can Say about Knowledge") offers Blackburn her explanationist account of knowledge, according to which "S knows that p iff p is a good explanation for an outsider of S's endorsement of p" (p. 73). How would this work with, say, normative knowledge? Jenkins suggests that we may understand token sentences (for example, 'Alaric behaved well') or minimalistically construed facts as explaining someone's endorsement of a normative claim by conveying to the audience that there are some suitable (e.g., good-making) non-normative facts that the person is being responsive to. (This is reminiscent of Blackburn's (1993) own appeal to the idea of 'program explanation' -- which is something that Jenkins doesn't mention.)

Jenkins then proposes, interestingly, that this idea provides the quasi-realist with resources for giving a straightforward answer to Sharon Street's (2011) 'Darwinian Dilemma'. Street asks what the relationship is supposed to be between mind-independent normative facts and our normative views. The quasi-realist can now say our values are explained (in part) by normative facts -- that we value honesty, for instance, because honesty is good (where this explanation points towards some non-normative properties such as, maybe, enhancing cooperation). This seems promising, although unlikely to satisfy Street, who demands an explanation for why we manage to track the normative truth as such, and doesn't allow for appeals to substantive normative commitments (e.g., regarding good-making features).

Macdonald ("What is Colour? A Defence of Colour Primitivism") defends color primitivism -- the view that colors are "simple irreducible or sui generis, perceiver independent, properties" (p. 123) that causally explain (for instance) our color experiences -- over response-dependence views and projectivism. MacDonald doesn't offer any kind of characterization of the projectivist view that she attributes to Blackburn, but I'll note that -- keeping in mind Dreier's and Jenkins's claims, above -- an analogical 'primitivist' account of normative properties might be quite compatible with an expressivist, quasi-realist view about normativity.

Horgan and Timmons ("Modest Quasi-Realism and the Problem of Deep Moral Error") rightly emphasize that a quasi-realist doesn't need to accommodate everything that a realist would want to say. They defend a Blackburn-style account of claims such as those of the form 'Ought p, but I might be wrong', according to which such claims express, roughly, endorsement of certain ways of revising one's attitudes plus a belief that such ways of revising one's attitudes might take one from accepting an ought-claim to rejecting it. A committed realist won't be persuaded, but Horgan and Timmons suggest that this is quite alright, as their account gives us everything that ordinary ought-thought asks for.

This leaves us with six more chapters. Antony ("Defending Folk Psychology: The Limits of Coalitions") charts the agreements and disagreements that she has with Blackburn when it comes to understanding folk psychology. While Antony applauds Blackburn's rejection of eliminativism and instrumentalism, she doesn't share Blackburn's worries about views on which the functional roles definitive of mental states are given in terms such that it is left for the future science to determine whether anything really realizes these roles. In Antony's view, folk psychology is best defended by appeal to a Fodorian language of thought hypothesis.

Beebee ("Causation, Projection, Inference, and Agency") explores "the prospects of a projectivist account of causation of the kind that Hume (thus interpreted) and, apparently, Blackburn endorse" (p. 25), and according to which causal thought is to be explained in terms of inferential commitments. Her suggestion is that in order to be able to account for the asymmetry of causation, a projectivist should embrace a 'Ramsey-Price' view, on which causal thought essentially stems from the perspective of a deliberating agent. The resulting projectivist account is then compared to Lewisian 'objectivism' (the gap between the views perhaps starting to look smaller than it might have appeared).

Jackson ("Singular Belief") asks, "within the possible worlds way of thinking about content and representation" (p. 49), how we should understand the content of singular beliefs (that is, beliefs about some particular things, e.g., Paris, or Jackson's computer), and whether states of having singular beliefs are existentially dependent on the existence of the objects that they're about.

Langton ("The Impossible Necessity of 'Filling in Space'") takes up Blackburn's train of thought, in "Filling in Space", to the conclusion that although we would seem to need categorical properties to ground dispositions, there's no way we can access these properties -- science only deals in the dispositional. Langton highlights the similarity between aspects of Blackburn's and David Lewis's 'epistemic humility', and briefly explores two lines of response. One involves appealing to a contextualist account of knowledge; the other appeals to the idea that properties may be both categorical and dispositional.

Gibbard ("Improving Sensibilities") argues that an expressivist cannot do everything in terms of sentiments, only, but needs to appeal to stances of agreeing and disagreeing with sentiments.

Finally, Schroeder ("Higher-Order Attitudes, Frege's Abyss, and the Truth in Propositions") revisits, in his very charming paper, the higher-order attitude response to the Frege-Geach problem, defending Blackburn from criticisms that Schroeder himself has earlier taken to be devastating. According to the higher-order attitude account, complex sentences express certain higher-order attitudes (for instance, 'if p, then q' could be taken to express disapproval of accepting p while rejecting q). The problem is that these complex sentences turn out to have the same inferential properties, on this account, as certain logically simple sentences deploying a predicate that expresses the relevant attitude (e.g., 'It's wrong to accept p while rejecting q'). Schroeder suggests that there's exactly one possible response to this problem: expressivists just need to take the relevant higher-order attitude to be an attitude of disagreement expressed by 'It's false that . . . ', and accept an account of propositions as mental states.


Blackburn, S., 1993. Essays in Quasi-Realism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Blackburn, S., 1998. Ruling Passions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Gibbard, A., 2003. Thinking How to Live. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.

Scanlon, T. M., 2014. Being Realistic about Reasons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Street, S., 2011, "Mind-Independence without Mystery," in R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 6. Oxford: Oxford University Press.