Assurance: An Austinian View of Knowledge and Knowledge Claims

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Krista Lawlor, Assurance: An Austinian View of Knowledge and Knowledge Claims, Oxford University Press, 2013, 231pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199657896.

Reviewed by Rebecca Kukla, Georgetown University


Krista Lawlor takes up many of the core problems in the theory of knowledge -- how to respond to skepticism, how to account for probabilistic and inductive knowledge, how practical interests impact epistemic status, and so forth -- through the lens of her pragmatic and semantic analysis of knowledge claims, or 'assurances.' She frames the book by taking assurances as a class of speech acts with a distinctive role in both epistemology and conversational pragmatics. Her analysis is heavily rooted in Austin's account of assuring, and in an Austinian approach to language more generally. Her basic thesis is that "the function of assurance is to give hearers exclusionary reasons" (19); that is, assuring is designed not just to put a proposition into play, but to end debate over the truth of the proposition. An assurance makes a claim to knowledge, where knowledge involves the ability to rule out "reasonable alternatives." Furthermore, Lawlor insists, assurances are inherently universal in the guarantee that they offer; they (purport to) give everyone exclusionary reasons.

Chapter 1 gives a neo-Austinian analysis of the pragmatics of assurances, along the lines just described. Lawlor takes special pains to explore the pragmatic contrast between assuring and asserting (of which more below). Chapters 2 and 3 develop an account of the semantics of knowledge claims. Lawlor argues for a contextualist, invariantist account of the meaning of 'knows.' She claims that although knowledge is a matter of ruling out reasonable alternatives, and although which alternatives are reasonable varies by both situational and conversational context, there are no contextual parameters on the meaning of 'knows' itself.

Chapter 4 represents a major shift, from a focus on language about knowledge to a focus on the nature of knowledge itself. Lawlor explores various problems surrounding probabilistic and inductive knowledge. Her standard argumentative form here is to show that apparent epistemological paradoxes and puzzles -- such as cases involving closure, indirect discourse, and knowledge of lottery propositions[1] -- dissolve once we see that they depend on thought experiments whose telling masks a shift in context in the middle that changes the reasonable alternatives in play. Chapter 5 examines what makes an alternative reasonable. Lawlor argues that reasonable alternatives are those that a reasonable person, with the speaker's interests, informed of the hearer's interests, would be concerned to eliminate.

Finally, Chapter 6 develops an Austinian response to radical skepticism, which, in her framework, is roughly the view that one must be able to rule out all alternatives to P in order to count as knowing P. She argues that once reasonable alternatives are ruled out, then one has actual justified knowledge, not just a close approximation. An interesting result of her analysis is that we don't, in fact, get to count as knowing huge, 'extraordinary' things, like that we are not brains in vats. This is roughly because these questions come up in philosophical contexts where other alternatives are indeed reasonable and can't be ruled out. Yet the absence of this kind of knowledge does not, she argues, undermine the reality and legitimacy of our knowledge of routine facts. This is an appealing and creative line of argument.

Lawlor's book is an ambitious and enjoyable read. Her emphasis on the act of assuring gives a fresh and helpful lens through which to view a series of familiar epistemological problems. The book is an important contribution to the growing body of literature at the interface of pragmatics, social epistemology, and traditional epistemology. In the rest of this review, I will raise four issues that seem to me to be worth further discussion. The first two concern the content of Lawlor's analysis, and the second two are methodological concerns.

Assurances vs. Assertions

It is critical for Lawlor to distinguish assurance from assertion. Examining epistemology through the lens of assurances, understood as their own, qualitatively distinct category of speech acts, is the motivation for the book's existence. I agree with her that assurances are interestingly distinct from routine assertions, but I am not convinced that she has carved out the distinction quite right, or completely consistently.

Clearly, both assuring and asserting P involve some sort of vouching for the truth of P (unlike promising to P, or ordering someone to P, or whatever). On Lawlor's view, assuring involves a different and stronger kind of guarantee that P. Assurance purports to end the need for debate in a way that assertion does not, and it does so in a way that claims reasons good enough for anyone (13 and elsewhere). Lawlor acknowledges that an assertion that P does more than just float P as an idea; rather, it clearly claims that P is true. Yet she wants asserting to fall short of purporting to end debate in the way assurance does. On this basis, she claims that assertions and assurances are structurally distinct classes of speech acts (44-45 and elsewhere), even though both serve to vouch for the truth of P.

Now on the one hand, it seems to me that all acts of asserting have to have a dimension of assurance as well. Surely part of the difference between asserting P and merely saying the words that make up P is that in the former case I am taking responsibility for being able to defend P. Conversely, it is hard to see how assurances can do the work Lawlor wants them to do unless they also serve to assert something, presumably something about the knowledge state of the speaker. If they had no assertoric force, it is difficult to see how they could have truth conditions, as she definitely thinks they do, given that she analyses these truth conditions in detail. She also takes for granted and relies upon the idea that assurances can serve as inferential premises, embeddable claims, and the like (123-4 and elsewhere). This all becomes mysterious if they have no assertoric force.

Lawlor heavily emphasizes the implicated universality of the reasons backing up an assurance: "With an assurance, one represents oneself as having reasons that should be good enough for anyone" (13). If I can import my own terminology developed elsewhere,[2] which I think makes Lawlor's point here easier to express: the output of an assurance is, on her view, agent neutral; it guarantees reasons that are not indexed to any particular audience. This is so even though its input is clearly agent relative; an assurance is a kind of guarantee backed up by a specific knower who "takes responsibility for" the proposition she claims she knows (44-45). An assurer grants to others the right to rely on her, specifically, for epistemic security, and in effect promises to provide exclusionary reasons as needed. "In offering an assurance . . . one represents oneself as in a position to offer conclusive reasons, to any and all comers, insofar as they are reasonable" (117).

But this is a problematic way to back up the special guarantee offered by assurances. First, I am not sure it is intuitively true. It's not hard to imagine someone saying to an interlocutor, "Look, you and I both know that P, but not everyone is going to accept that (because they are blinded to some reasons by ideology, or not smart enough to understand the reasons, or whatever)." This still seems to be an assurance. Likewise, one might use an assurance specifically to sidestep the need to provide one's reasons, by leveraging one's social epistemic authority instead. A parent might say to a child, or an expert to a layperson, "I know that P, just leave it at that" as a way of foreclosing rather than inviting a discussion of reasons. Furthermore, one might use an assurance to back up a claim specifically when the reasons are difficult or impossible to articulate -- when they depend on technically skilled perception, perhaps. An assurance in such cases can substitute for the offer of reasons.

In addition, it is not clear that her description of the type of guarantee offered by assurances can separate them from assertions, which seem to be similarly impersonal. Lawlor defends the universality of the output of assurances by pointing out that they provide a guarantee not just to their conversational audience, but to any overhearer -- unlike, say, a promise or an imperative, which makes a normative claim only on the person or people at whom it is directed. But assertions function the same way, providing the same sort of truth claim to overhearers as to intended listeners.

Finally, it is not clear why she needs this kind of universality of scope. She writes as though the agent-neutrality of the reasons is the same thing as or at least directly supports their definitive or exclusionary character. But these seem to be two different issues. A speech act may provide exclusionary reasons for accepting P to some listeners and not others, or it may provide less-than-exclusionary reasons for everyone. We can assess speech acts that vouch for P on either continuum: how wide their scope is, and how indefeasible a guarantee they offer. And this seems true of both assertions and assurances. None of this is to take issue with Lawlor's claim that assurances are pragmatically and epistemically distinctive and important. Rather, it is to challenge the neatness of her demarcation criteria.

Truth vs. Meaning

A centerpiece of Lawlor's account is her attempt to resolve the seeming tension between her proposal that knowing requires eliminating reasonable alternatives (where these are context-specific) and her insistence that knowledge claims are absolute. Her route to resolution is to separate the meaning of knowledge claims from their truth conditions, and she develops this proposal throughout Chapter 2. Specifically, she claims that the meaning of a knowledge claim is that all alternatives can be definitively ruled out, but the claim is true as long as all situationally reasonable alternatives can be ruled out (63 and elsewhere).

However, absent a specific account of meaning that detaches it from truth conditions, I am not sure how to assess this proposal. Of course, truth-conditional semantics is not the only game in town, but it's a dominant game, and I have few to no intuitions about how to assess such a specific semantic claim without an alternative semantic theory explicitly on the table. Separating meanings from truth conditions raises various puzzles that Lawlor does not acknowledge. For example, she talks about what follows deductively from the meaning of a knowledge claim. But since meanings and truth conditions don't track one another on her account, this means she is committed to a notion of valid inference that is distinct from truth-preservation. We surely can't take such a thing for granted.

Since I don't have direct access to abstract propositional contents (if there are such things), the only way I have of checking my intuitions as to what something means is by thinking about the concrete upshot of saying it. And this concrete upshot doesn't seem fine-grained enough to me to allow for separable intuitions about meaning and about truth conditions. It seems to me that Lawlor's own semantic vocabulary deepens rather than assuages this worry. For instance, she frequently talks about speech acts "putting Russellian propositions into play," to get at their conveyance of a meaning. But I honestly don't know what sort of "play" this is, if not the kind of play that invokes truth conditions, and this is especially so given the notorious metaphysical slipperiness of propositions themselves. In fact, Lawlor depends on stable distinctions between truth conditions, meanings, pragmatic implications, and communicative content. While all of these could be distinguished in various ways, it seems to me to require a specific theory of each before we can have stable intuitions as to what parts of the concrete upshot of a speech act belong to or result from which of these.

Linguistic Data and the Role of Intuitions

Throughout the book, but in Chapter 3 in particular (which claims to be about "linguistic data"), Lawlor relies heavily on intuitions about language use in assessing what "people" will or won't say, accept, challenge, and the like. These are empirical claims that strike me as likely to vary by local culture, personality, speaker-audience relationship, and sub-community. For example she writes, "When a speaker is fully aware of a difference in epistemic situation, he or she will resist allowing a knowledge claim that concerns a different situation to have any role in his or her own conversation, about his or her own situation" (89). This is an awfully specific claim, one that strikes me as more plausible in conversations among philosophers trained up on epistemological worries than in general lay conversations. Or compare: "It is natural to say 'P, but see for yourself'; it's not so natural to say 'I know P, but see for yourself'" (19). I just don't share this second intuition at all (which goes back to why I am suspicious of her claim that assurances always have agent neutral outputs). For those with compromised epistemic authority in particular (but not exclusively), it's not uncommon to be in a position where one's high-quality testimony just won't be enough for some listeners. In general, how willing people are to contradict one another and or let one another's words stand, and when they are willing to vocally disagree, is just the sort of thing that varies greatly depending upon the power relationships and perceptions of authority among speakers. Hence our own intuitions about how people talk about such things, even if we share them (which we apparently don't, always) seem like really shaky data.

My point here is not to reiterate or invoke the entire debate around experimental philosophy and the proper philosophical role of intuitions. One might claim that systematic empirical data are unnecessary when it comes to analyzing theoretical concepts about which philosophers arguably have special expertise, such as justification or obligation perhaps. But such a claim becomes seriously implausible when it comes to analyzing actual, empirical language use. This is especially so since philosophers are not exactly representative conversationalists. We have our own turns of phrase, points of resistance, and conversational rhythms. And I would think we would be an especially eccentric bunch when it comes to how we talk about knowledge claims.

Keeping the Pragmatic in View

At the start of the book, Lawlor gives a great deal of attention to the pragmatic texture of assurances, taken as speech acts situated within conversational contexts, and offered from specific speakers to specific audiences. This is, in my view, one of the central strengths of her approach. As the book goes on, however, she seems to lose sight of this focus in two ways. First, she seems to care less about the pragmatic details, reverting to a flattened, homogeneous, and sometimes sloppy picture of the conversational terrain. Second, by the end of the book, when her concerns are almost entirely epistemological, she seems to lose her grip on her initial commitment to linguistic pragmatics mattering at all.

Consider a quotation like this: "It is often said that speech acts are plays in conversational games. If so, then claiming to know is making a move in a game, the game of giving and receiving assurances" (66-67). This is surely too simple: giving and receiving assurances is not an independent game. We don't, in any normal conversation, trade assurances back and forth; rather, assurances are embedded in more elaborate conversational games involving a wide variety of speech acts. Similarly, drawing on terminology made standard by Robert Brandom and David Lewis, among others, Lawlor often refers to 'the' conversational scoreboard, and what claims are on it. But conversational scores are not single in this way. We use language to do much more than trade truth claims back and forth, and one cannot model the normative commitments that shift around during conversations with a list of propositions. We also create moral obligations, forge commitments to act, impugn one another's trustworthiness, establish group boundaries, and much, much more. I do not think Lawlor's oversimplification is innocent, given that her goal is to illuminate epistemology by way of the pragmatic texture of knowledge claims. Given that goal, surely it matters how those claims are situated in broader discursive contexts.

The role of speech acts and their pragmatic form diminishes as the book goes on, and has, as far as I can tell, disappeared almost completely by the time we reach the closing discussion of skepticism. Furthermore, the connection between assurance and knowledge becomes increasingly abstract as her analysis progresses. For instance, near the end, she writes, "This skeptical rejoinder expresses a craving for assurance of its own kind -- an assurance that one is not in a dreadful epistemic situation" (217). Here, assurance seems to just mean something like 'confidence' or 'feeling of comfort,' and it doesn't seem to refer to a concrete speech act at all. But this is a distinction that ought to matter to Lawlor in particular.

I would have liked to see her sustain attention to pragmatic detail throughout the book, as this emphasis is one of the main things that make her work a distinctive and exciting contribution to epistemology -- which it remains, despite my worries and calls for greater clarity or development.

[1] That is, knowledge (or lack thereof) that some extraordinarily unlikely outcome will not occur.

[2] See R. Kukla and M. Lance, ‘Yo!’ and ‘Lo!’: The Pragmatic Topography of the Space of Reasons (Harvard University Press, 2009).